Carving Nature at Its Joints: Natural Kinds in Metaphysics and Science

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Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O'Rourke, and Matthew H. Slater (eds.), Carving Nature at Its Joints: Natural Kinds in Metaphysics and Science, MIT Press, 2011, 355pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 978-0-262-51626-6.

Reviewed by P.D. Magnus, University at Albany SUNY


This volume collects fourteen essays which were originally delivered as talks at the 2008 Inland Northwest Philosophy Conference. They cover a wide range of topics, and some of them are very good.

The range is so tremendous that the volume often seems to lose focus. The title of the collection, a metaphor from Plato, is now the standard motto for discussions of natural kinds. The subtitle invokes metaphysics and science. So one might expect every contribution to address at least two out of three: natural kinds, metaphysics, and science. The foreword (by John Dupré) and the introduction (by Matthew H. Slater and Andrea Borghini) take a broad view of the terrain, and they provide a good introduction to debates at the intersection of the three topics in the title. Surprisingly, however, a number of the essays fail to address some or even all of the terms from the title.

Especially striking are the essays that do not address 'natural kinds' at all. In some of these, one can see the implicit connections. Bruce Glymour's contribution, for example, contrasts two approaches to evolutionary theory. The population strategy models populations altogether in terms of general laws. The reductive strategy begins with considerations of individual organisms and builds models tailored to their peculiarities. He argues convincingly in favor of the reductive strategy. Although not expressed in the idiom of 'natural kinds', the points are not too hard to translate: his argument raises concerns about biological groups that support inductive inference, about the categories which are appropriate for science, and about the terms that appear in laws. Some of the other essays, like Kadri Vihvelin's contribution on free will and determinism, seem totally unconnected to the theme.

To be fair, part of the problem is with natural kinds themselves. The phrase 'natural kind' is too often used as a term of philosophical jargon with the presumption that it has a precise meaning, even though there are a number of separate precise meanings that it might have. First, 'natural kinds' may refer to categories which will support inductive inference. Second, 'natural kinds' may refer to whichever categories ought to appear in scientific accounts of the world. Third, 'natural kinds' may refer to metaphysically robust categories which are written in the fundament of being or which structure the space of possible worlds. Fourth, 'natural kinds' may refer to the categories which appear as predicates in the laws of nature. Fifth, 'natural kinds' may refer to categories which anchor a special kind of reference.

Although these five aspects do overlap somewhat, there are difficulties with each and tensions between them. Essays in the volume document some of these difficulties.

In his contribution, Peter Godfrey-Smith problematizes the connection between induction and natural kinds. Inductive inference, he contends, comes in two importantly different forms. The first form generalizes from many measurements of randomly selected individuals. This does not require that the population correspond to a natural kind at all, but only that the sample be genuinely random and sufficiently large. The second form generalizes from a single or just a few individuals. This requires that there is an underlying cause or dependence which guarantees that other members of the category are like these few; that is, it requires that the category be a natural kind. Of course, if there is a whole class of inductive inferences that has nothing to do with natural kinds, then we cannot define natural kinds in terms of induction.

Other essays highlight the tension between kinds suited for fundamental metaphysics and kinds suited for philosophy of science. Consider the contrast between the contributions by Achille C. Varzi and the one by Neil E. Williams. Varzi argues that the categories which scientists identify are conventional rather than robustly real, and he thinks this must hold even if the world constrains enquiry so much that one convention is determinately the best. He writes, "We may adopt a convention precisely because it is the best choice, but an arbitrary choice it remains" (p. 147). Williams is concerned not with kinds in the abstract, but with the specific case of rheumatoid arthritis. Even though arthritis is not one of the fundamental existents, he argues, medical accounts which identify it are motivated by legitimate scientific considerations. He sees this as a reason to adopt a conception of natural kind which can recognize these merits of arthritis as a category. If we refuse to recognize arthritis as a natural kind so-called, then we would need another term to acknowledge its status as a genuine feature of the world as medicine finds it. Because metaphysical depth and scientific utility come apart, and because Varzi and Williams part ways in what they demand of natural kinds, it may be tempting to think that they are really just talking about different things.

The connection with laws of nature is explored in contributions by Marc Lange and Alexander Bird. Lange argues that laws of nature must have different degrees of necessity and that natural kinds appear explicitly only in the somewhat less necessary ones. Crudely put, the idea is that we can sensibly ask about different fundamental particles than the ones that exist. In saying how they would behave, we apply the same force laws that govern the particles which actually are fundamental. So the laws which govern the particles must be more general (in a sense, more necessary) than the laws which specify some particles as fundamental. Bird argues directly against Lange on this point, raising several objections. The arguments turn on more subtle nomic considerations than I can relate here. Noa Latham's contribution is also about laws of nature; he considers the question of whether laws are metaphysically necessary or not, arguing that this dispute is in part a purely verbal matter. Anyone interested in laws, especially in Lange's account of laws, should take a look at these essays.

Except in brief asides, the essays do not address the connection between natural kinds and semantics. Given that talk about natural kinds in recent decades was impelled by work in semantics by Kripke and Putnam, this could seem like an oversight. The counterpoint is that thinking about natural kinds is too often eclipsed by thinking about natural kind terms. I found it refreshing that the discussions here do not become embrangled in questions of philosophy of language. Readers interested in the overlap between natural kinds and semantics have no dearth of other options.[1]

The overall imprecision about what constitutes a natural kind is exploited by Roy Sorenson in his essay. He argues that blackness, shadows, vacuums, and cold meet many of the usual conditions for counting as natural kinds. They support inductions, they appear in scientific accounts of phenomena, they conform to law-like regularities, and our terms for them behave rather like canonical natural kind terms. They are kinds of absence rather than kinds of stuff, however. He dubs these para-natural kinds. We should not be squeamish about acknowledging them in our ontology, he suggests, because it does not involve acknowledging any more stuff in the world than there would be without them.

Some of the contributions discuss natural kinds at a level of abstraction, without carefully considering any specific examples. For those that do consider examples, the details of their accounts are influenced by their exemplars. Authors who begin with a focus on fundamental particles tend to wind up thinking differently about kinds than ones who start elsewhere. Lange is primarily concerned with elementary particles and perhaps only with some of them. More of the contributions consider examples from biology. Michael Devitt argues that concerns about the reality of species are better understood as concerns about whether species are natural kinds. The contributions by Jason G. Rheins and by Judith K. Crane and Ronald Sandler also address the species problem. Bence Nanay argues against essentialism about natural kinds, both in general and because it fails to make sense of kinds in biology. Williams' discussion of arthritis raises interesting problems that do not arise for particles or species. A disease is not a class of things in the same way that the kinds electron or mallard are, so he is forced to address a general question of how a disease can count as a kind at all. And Sorenson discusses examples which he is well aware are metaphysically suspect. This diversity of examples is a positive feature of the volume; if anything, I would have liked to see more new examples and fewer abstract invocations of old saws.

Part of the issue is not with the volume, then, but with 'natural kind' itself. Discussions of natural kinds follow distinct routes through different philosophical terrain to divergent examples. Although the collection is less unified than one might have desired, perhaps it is as unified as one ought to have expected.

Because of the eclectic spread of topics, this volume is ill-suited to serve as a guide or an introduction. That said, there are some excellent essays here. Anyone working on the topics addressed would do well to look at the relevant chapters. I especially enjoyed the contributions by Glymour, Godfrey-Smith, Sorenson, and Williams. Readers with different interests than mine might be drawn to other essays, and a different focus might lead them to identify other articles as excellent ones.

[1] E.g., see the recent anthology The Semantics and Metaphysics of Natural Kinds, Helen Beebee and Nigel Sabbarton-Leary (eds.), Routledge, 2010.