Catching Capital: The Ethics of Tax Competition

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Peter Dietsch, Catching Capital: The Ethics of Tax Competition, Oxford University Press, 2015, 264pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190251512.  

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University, and Marco Meyer, University of Cambridge/University of Groningen 


With this fine book on tax competition, Peter Dietsch makes a timely contribution to the global justice literature. He rightly observes that "The shift in the distributive justice literature from domestic justice to global justice that has taken place over the last twenty years has failed to pick up on the fact that the interactions between different tax systems have dynamics all their own" (p. 11). His book examines these interactions comprehensively, addressing three kinds of tax competition.

The first is competition for portfolio capital. Wealthy individuals shift liquid capital (i.e., cash deposits, equity, security holdings) offshore to avoid paying income tax on its revenue, or capital gains tax on re-sale profits; both are typically levied based on residence. Shifting of portfolio capital occurs on a huge scale. As Dietsch reports, 10% of all European liquid wealth was recently estimated to be held offshore (US$ 3.7 trillion). The share is even higher elsewhere (50% for Latin America, 70% for the Middle East). Worldwide, an estimated US$ 21-31 trillion are held offshore (p. 3).

The second kind is competition for paper profits. Multi-national corporations shift profits from states with high tax rates on corporate profits to locations with low rates. They are "paper profits" in the sense that they are not realized in the jurisdiction where they are claimed. According to Dietsch, "For MNEs, not paying taxes has become part of what it means to stay competitive" (p. 5).

The third kind is competition for foreign direct investment (FDI). FDIs are substantial investments in an enterprise by an entity based in another country, usually involving a controlling ownership stake. Consider an American company wanting to set up a production plant abroad. One factor that may figure in its decision is tax rates. While lower rates may lead to additional economic activity, Dietsch makes the simplifying assumption that the amount of investments is fixed; the question is whether companies invest domestically or abroad, and if abroad, which country. Countries can attempt to attract foreign investment by setting tax rates favorable to investors. Ireland, for instance, attracted substantial FDI by levying low taxes on foreign corporate profits.

The core idea behind Dietsch's normative arguments against tax competition is that states should enjoy fiscal autonomy. Fiscal autonomy is fully realized if states can exercise their fiscal prerogative. For democratic states, that prerogative is the ability to determine the size of the public budget relative to GDP, and the level of redistribution in accordance with the preferences of their citizens. Chapter 1 sets the stage for Dietsch's argument. He develops a conception of the value of fiscal autonomy, and argues that tax competition is bad principally because it undermines the self-determination of states. Chapter 2 makes a case for institutional reform to fight tax competition. Dietsch engages with several prominent policy proposals arguing that they fall short. He develops an alternative proposal, and discusses the institutional reforms required to implement them. Chapter 3 responds to the objection that Dietsch's proposed form of tax cooperation is inefficient. Dietsch distinguishes several notions of economic efficiency at play in the economics literature on tax competition, and rebuts objections that his proposed form of tax cooperation is inefficient. Chapter 4 responds to the objection that his proposal undermines national sovereignty. Dietsch suggests a revised conception of sovereignty, according to which tax cooperation is actually required by national sovereignty. Chapter 5 discusses ethical questions that arise under tax competition and the transition to a more just institutional framework.

Our focus is on the normative core of Dietsch's proposal and its implications for reform. We have little to say about chapter 3, with its nuanced discussion directed at those who think considerations of economic growth and Pareto optimality justify tax competition. We also leave aside the important issues Dietsch raises in chapter 5 about the transition to tax cooperation.

What is bad about tax competition, and for whom is it bad?

Tax competition makes it possible for corporations and wealthy individuals to exempt themselves from the social contracts of their home countries. As Dietsch argues, tax competition undermines the fiscal autonomy of states by effectively removing their autonomy prerogative, in two ways (p. 48). First, by putting downward pressure on tax rates on mobile capital, tax competition squeezes government revenues. As a consequence, if, for instance, citizens have democratic preferences calling for high rates, states will find it practically impossible to implement such tax rates without shrinking their economy. Secondly, tax competition tends to lead to more regressive fiscal regimes, which may well be at odds with the democratic preferences of citizens concerning the level of redistribution.

Dietsch also worries that tax competition widens the income gap between capital owners and everyone else, as well as between rich and poor countries (p. 31). For instance, to make up for the loss in tax revenue due to tax competition, countries either have to tax labor more heavily, or else impose expenditure-based taxes (such as VAT) falling disproportionately on lower income groups. These consequences hit developing countries especially hard. Developing countries lose more than thrice the money they receive in foreign aid to tax havens (p. 51). This further concern with inequality is rather different from the complaint about fiscal autonomy. First, fiscal autonomy is compatible with high levels of inequality between capital owners and everyone else if the majority of citizens in a democracy prefer it that way. Secondly, fiscal autonomy is silent about the inequalities between rich and poor countries, as it only requires that states can determine the level of the public budget relative to GDP, with the GDP taken as given. Dietsch does not follow up on this worry about inequality. We return to this point below.

Other things being equal, tax competition benefits small rather than big countries (pp. 55ff). That is, in the competition for increasing their tax base, countries offer favorable conditions to create incentives for relocation. Countries incur losses by lowering their tax rates. For big countries this will often not be evened out by the increase in the tax basis. The number of individuals and corporations attracted is not large enough to offset the losses across the board. But for small countries, relocations can more readily make up for such losses. So countries like Luxembourg, Switzerland and Singapore benefit most from tax competition. But some small poor countries such as Panama also benefit. The losers are big poor countries.

What not to do about tax competition?

Before developing his own reform proposals, Dietsch rejects some proposals currently on the table. Firstly, he rejects the introduction of global taxes, such as financial transaction taxes or global resource dividends. His opposition is pragmatic: he holds it would be unrealistic to impose such taxes in the current global order. But Dietsch also opposes global taxes normatively. He argues that justifying global taxes would depend on a substantial theory of global justice, which he considers too controversial a basis for winning an argument (pp. 65-66). We disagree. We think that debates about global justice are worth having, even in the political domain. More importantly, as we argue below, Dietsch cannot avoid taking a stance on global justice.

Secondly, Dietsch rejects unilateral measures to protect one's tax base, such as the US Foreign Account Tax Compliance Act (FATCA). This act imposes reporting duties on foreign banks: they must report on the holdings of American customers or face heavy interference with their American business. This approach requires strong regulatory capacities unlikely to be found in large poor countries. In any event, international efforts would be better since any given country that takes such measure will still have incentives to do itself what it tries to prevent others from doing (pp. 70-73). In brief, Dietsch thinks unilateral measures will not suffice to guarantee the fiscal autonomy of states.

Thirdly, Dietsch rejects capital controls (controls on the flow of capital). He acknowledges room for such controls when foreign-source capital cannot effectively be taxed (pp. 68-70). But he holds that when international cooperation to tax foreign-source capital is possible, more sophisticated tools, like the one that Dietsch proposes, should be used,. In short, capital controls are too blunt.

Dietsch's reasons for rejecting these proposals point to the contours of his own proposal. Unilateral solutions are insufficient effectively to fight tax competition: multilateral institutional solutions are needed. Global taxes are normatively too demanding; we must start from currently accepted norms and ways the international realm is structured, including sovereign states. Capital controls are too blunt; we need more sophisticated institutional arrangements that preserve the fiscal autonomy of states.

How to Protect Fiscal Autonomy?

Dietsch proposes an International Tax Organization (ITO). It would provide a forum for governments to negotiate agreements on the rules of international taxation and would ensure those rules are enforced. To fight the paperization of real profits Dietsch favors a "unitary tax with formulaic apportionment" (p. 75). This system proposes first to calculate the word-wide profits of multi-national-companies, and then distribute claims to tax shares of these profits to states according to a formula that reflects the company's economic activity in each country by considering factors such as property, sales, and payroll (p. 107). The ITO would leave it to each country to tax their allotted share of corporate profits according to a rate set in accordance with the preferences of its citizenry, as long as it does not undermine the fiscal autonomy of other states.

To support his institutional proposal, Dietsch proceeds in two steps: first spelling out which regulative principles are needed to protect fiscal autonomy, and then showing that his proposal honors these principles. He thinks of the preservation of fiscal autonomy as parallel to setting the limits of liberty for individuals. "The basic challenge of this book," he writes, "is to identify where the boundaries of the fiscal autonomy prerogative should lie, and what institutions might serve to protect them" (p. 79).

Dietsch suggests two regulative principles meant to jointly protect the fiscal autonomy of states (principles that go back to joint work with Thomas Rixen):

"Under fiscal interdependence (given capital mobility among fiscally diverse, democratic states) and provided just background global governance institutions:

(1) Natural and legal persons are liable to pay tax in the state of which they are a member (the 'membership principle'). This requires transparency between taxpayers and their tax authorities, as well as between tax authorities (the 'transparency corollary').

(2) Any fiscal policy of a state is unjust and should be prohibited if it is both strategically motivated and has a negative impact on the aggregate fiscal self-determination of other states (the 'fiscal policy constraint')." (p. 80)

The scope of these principles is initially limited to democratic states. The guiding value is democratic self-determination. The spirit is that all individuals natural and legal, qua members of states, must make a fair contribution to their community, where the "fair" contribution is the level of taxation assessed by democratically sanctioned legislation. To give reassurance that all members make their fair contribution, there must be transparency between individuals and states as well as among states. (Dietsch does not support the radical Swedish practice to allow citizens to see tax declarations of other citizens.) All democratic communities may set their fiscal policy. But they must do so in a way that captures authentic collective preferences for a certain kind of fiscal policy, which may lead to a broad range of social services, as in Sweden, or a more limited range, as in the US. What democratic communities must not do is strategically choose policies motivated to increase tax revenue, if those attract individuals or economic activity in a such way that average fiscal self-determination across countries declines.

For non-democracies authentically aggregated views do not exist. The proposal for such states is to set a floor for capital taxation and impose controls on capital flows to guarantee a level playing field (pp. 182-186).

The Membership Principle

According to the Membership Principle, persons and companies should pay taxes where they are members. Being a member means you take advantage of the infrastructure provided by a community, as either an individual or a corporation. So you should contribute appropriately to this community. In a democratic context "appropriate" contributions are determined by democratic processes. For members of multiple communities (individual or corporations) the tax system must be devised so that one's partial membership status in each is appropriately taken into account. Taxes for corporate profits of corporations should be fairly apportioned in proportion to the extent of their operation in the given location. This principle renders competition for portfolio capital and paper profits illegitimate: both count as "poaching." Poaching contrasts with "luring," which covers tax competition for FDI by inviting capital to migrate. The institutional implications of avoiding poaching are substantial. Bank secrecy and refusal to exchange information with other administrations are ruled out, as is the provision of deliberately legally-opaque constructions that mislead tax authorities (p. 105). Punishment for tax evasion should be more severe.

If poaching is ruled out, luring will become more attractive, inviting capital to migrate. That renders an investigation of the second principle central.

The Fiscal Policy Constraint

The fiscal policy constraint embodied in Dietsch's second principle is designed to rule out the luring of FDI to one's tax jurisdiction, by disallowing strategic tax setting that has a negative impact on aggregate fiscal self-determination. Dietsch is aware that implementation would cause difficulties, both in the assessment of intention and in determining the badness of the outcome. But the WTO has been operating with structurally similar principles, including assessments of counterfactual outcomes and intentions of parties (p. 10). However our issue with the constraint is not about implementation but about philosophical foundations.

It is hard to see what would be wrong with luring. Consider the case of Singapore, lucidly described in Alberto Alesina and Enrico Spolaore's Size of Nations (2003). Singapore lacks the advantages enjoyed by large nations: economies of scale, the ability to internalize the positive effects it creates in the region, and the military strength accompanying a larger population. Why should they not capitalize on the few advantages of being small and adopt fiscal policies to attract wealthy individuals and new foreign companies chiefly among them? Yet Dietsch insists luring is wrong if it is driven by bad intentions and leads to bad outcomes. He starts out considering a principle that only appeals to bad outcomes. When he finds this principle lacking, he considers a principle that only appeals to bad intentions. This principle also fails. However, Dietsch finds that treating both bad outcomes and bad intentions as necessary components of an overarching principle yields plausible results.

Let us retrace his steps. As far as the purely outcome-based argument is concerned, Dietsch considers a principle according to which a country is not permitted to enact any kind of measure that would lure individuals (persons or companies) away from other countries if in the aggregate this will reduce fiscal self-determination (p.95). So if companies relocate from Sweden to the UK because the UK offers a business climate they find more adequate, and if Sweden thereby loses more in fiscal self-determination than the UK gains (and thus the aggregate is negative), then the British policies that generated these incentives are illegitimate. Dietsch thinks this criterion overshoots because the UK may have had no intention to attract Swedish business. The UK may just have exercised its right for fiscal self-determination. Relocations from Sweden are an unintended side-effect.

Dietsch then considers a purely intention-based argument. According to that argument, the problem with luring is not that the global net-outcome in terms of fiscal self-determination is reduced, but that there is an actual intention of luring away persons or corporations from elsewhere. This argument, too, overshoots according to Dietsch: there are morally permissible ways of intending to attract foreign investment, say, through improvements in infrastructure. Such measures might instigate a race to the top by getting other countries to take measures to give individuals and corporations incentives to stay put.

But while Dietsch thinks both arguments overshoot, he submits that a combined version does not have that problem. He proposes that a tax policy is illegitimate if it is both "strategic" (designed to lure) and has bad outcomes in terms of aggregate fiscal self-determination. The criterion for a tax policy being strategic is counterfactual: the country would not pursue it if it did not expect to attract newcomers. So countries can pursue their authentic democratic preferences, and if new members want to join them in response to that, they can, unless fiscal independence is negatively affected in the aggregate. Recall Dietsch's parallel liberty: each person's liberty is constrained by the liberty of others.

There are internal issues with both the outcome-based and the intention-based component. Regarding the outcome-based component, his view presupposes some measure of aggregate fiscal sovereignty to decide whether an outcome is good or bad according to his proposed criterion of whether aggregate fiscal sovereignty has increased or decreased. But many different such measures can be devised, and defending a particular measure will require appeal to controversial assumptions about global justice that Dietsch seeks to avoid.

Regarding the intention-based component, Dietsch needs to contend with the objections raised against the moral significance of intentions in discussions of the principle of double effect. T. M. Scanlon and Judith Thompson argue that while intentions matter for the moral evaluation of the character of agents, they do not make a difference in assessing actions. Even if a way of attributing intentions to citizens can be devised, Dietsch's proposal faces another problem. He needs to give an account of how to aggregate the democratic preferences of individual citizens. The aggregate democratic preferences of citizens will presumably need to bear some relationship to the intentions of individual citizens. But these intentions will often be highly heterogeneous. What if a number of citizens turn out to have strategic intentions, whereas the intentions of others are genuine?

We won't pursue these internal criticisms further because we have a more fundamental worry. Dietsch introduces two criteria, finds them both wanting because they go too far and thus need to be curtailed, and then curtails them by combining them. But this strategy begs the question of why countries have obligations of the sort he seeks to spell out to begin with. Both criteria presuppose that countries have obligations to maintain each other's fiscal autonomy under circumstances of fiscal interdependence. In fact, Dietsch insists on a strong version of that view. His second principle condemns Singapore, Switzerland and Luxembourg for offering a set of fiscal policies that attracts businesses and individuals even if these countries lure away only persons and companies from rich countries. Singapore would be condemned for attracting Americans, assuming the US's fiscal autonomy diminishes more than Singapore's increases, and Luxembourg for attracting French investors under a parallel assumption. It is not obvious that this would be so.

What is more, once we realize the fiscal policy constraint delivers these controversial judgments, it becomes clear that the notion of fiscal autonomy (which the fiscal policy constraint is supposed to operationalize) is itself controversial. Whereas Dietsch insists it is neutral regarding theories of global justice (pp. 64f, pp. 119-123), we submit that it presupposes a peculiar and in fact misguided view in the global justice debate.

Is Fiscal Autonomy Neutral Regarding Theories of Global Justice?

Dietsch's book addresses an interdisciplinary audience interested in global taxation. Hence he proposes to avoid foundational questions about global justice, and rather hopes to proceed from assumptions about tax justice that could become globally shared.

However, on closer inspection the ideal of fiscal autonomy he puts forward is not as uncontroversial as it may seem. Recall that fiscal autonomy requires the ability of states to determine the size of the public budget relative to GDP and the level of redistribution in accordance with the democratic preferences of their citizens. Dietsch assumes not only that each country tries to pursue its fiscal autonomy, but also that each country should seek to enable every other country to exercise its fiscal autonomy as well. This substantial commitment underlies both the membership principle and the fiscal policy constraint. Why take on this particular commitment?

Dietsch acknowledges that tax competition also tends to increase inequality between rich and poor countries. But fiscal autonomy does not address this problem. An ITO with a powerful mandate to safeguard fiscal autonomy would need to stand by idly if tax competition leads to slow growth or even stagnation in large developing countries, even if it undermines basic institutional capabilities of these states, as long as their ability to set government revenues relative to GDP is in accordance with the democratic preferences of its citizens. Instead of sidestepping issues regarding global justice, Dietsch takes a highly committed position indeed. It becomes clear that the approach he endorses is Miriam Ronzoni's account of international background justice (pp. 119-123).

Ronzoni on Global Justice

Ronzoni has argued that there is a demand of justice to reform the global order to eliminate background injustice.1 Her argument starts from an analysis of domestic justice, which she then applies to the global order. For the domestic case, the argument goes as follows. Contracts that people enter into with each other are morally binding only if certain background conditions obtain. For example, none of the agents must be coerced into entering the contract, the environment in which the contract operates must be suitably predictable, and none of the partners to the contract should dominate the other parties to the contract. In general, to ensure the initial bindingness of contracts, background conditions must be such that citizens can make such contracts in a free and fair manner. (And in order to stay binding, the contractual basis must not be frustrated.) The job of the basic institutions of society is to maintain background justice, by preserving "certain social relationships among individuals or among other kinds of actors" (p. 240).

Those institutions in turn must be arranged properly so that they can do the assigned job. What counts as a proper arrangement is spelled out by Rawls's two principles of justice. Individuals are engaging in certain practices within which certain moral demands on the exercise of that practice can be developed (especially contracts). But possibly many contracts over time then cumulatively create circumstances that arose the presuppositions under which these practices can be exercised in morally acceptable ways. For example, a large imbalance of power between citizens could undermine the possibility that contracts are freely and fairly concluded. A properly regulated basic structure maintains domestic background justice.

Ronzoni develops a parallel argument for the global order. She takes her approach to transcend the debate between cosmopolitans, who think there is a global basic structure that parallels Rawls' domestic basic structure, and statists, who deny that there is a global basic structure. On her view, "the most pressing question is not whether we have a global basic structure, but whether we need one" (p. 243). Just as practices of contracting at the domestic level presuppose a background of just domestic institutions, so the states practices of delivering social justice within their own boundaries and among their own citizens presuppose just global background institutions. Parallel to the domestic level we get an argument for an appropriate set of international institutions to preserve the ability of states to deliver justice at home (p. 246). Tax competition is the example she develops most extensively.

However, we doubt that Ronzoni's argument carries over from the domestic case. Consider the inhabitants of country A. They are closely intertwined in cooperative structures whose rules are coercively enforced. It is because of the links among the inhabitants of A that Ronzoni's argument that the creation of a properly regulated background structure is needed gains credibility. But internationally we have quite a different situation. More or less mutually exclusive groups of individuals live in different countries A, B, C, . . . In addition, certain inhabitants of A, B, C, . . . are connected in certain ways. Quite plausibly, some of the ways in which inhabitants of A, B, C, . . . are connected ground certain claims of justice (which would have to be argued for independently).

But why would it be the concern of inhabitants of B that inhabitants of A live in a just state? How much exactly do they have to do for inhabitants of A to make sure they can do so? The difference between the domestic case and the international case is substantial. Domestically we are talking about obligations among the inhabitants of the same state, whereas internationally we are talking about obligations across states.

Ronzoni insists that the fact that domestic justice can be undermined by international practices is a reason to think of the international order as posing a problem of background injustice. Thus there are obligations of justice to create a certain kind of global order, one that would ensure background justice analogous to the domestic case. Dietsch adopts this standpoint uncritically when he puts forward the ideal of fiscal autonomy that requires of the inhabitants of each state to conduct domestic tax policies in such a way that inhabitants of all other states can exercise their fiscal prerogative. But neither Ronzoni nor Dietsch offers a convincing reason why citizens should have such far-reaching obligations to citizens of other countries.


We started our critical appraisal of the ideal of fiscal autonomy from the hunch that the fiscal policy constraint which is supposed to partly operationalize fiscal autonomy is too strong: it seems doubtful that Singapore would commit an injustice by luring away capital from the US, or Luxembourg by luring away investors from France. Dietsch relies on a particular theory of global justice, namely Ronzoni's. We have also argued that neither Dietsch nor Ronzoni offers an argument that supports the fiscal policy constraint.

However, we do find it plausible that Singapore would commit an injustice when luring away capital from India, Indonesia or Malaysia. In closing, we suggest that there is an argument for this conclusion. But it requires adopting a different framework for thinking about global justice, namely the ground-of-justice approach one of us has developed.2 The grounds-of-justice approach avoids the result that luring away capital from other rich countries would be unjust for Singapore. According to this approach, human beings owe certain (basic) things to each other in virtue of their common humanity, and that generates an obligation to offer assistance in building institutions. On this ground, tax competition is bad if rich countries lure capital away from poor countries, insofar as this interferes with the institutional development of poor countries. But in the case of wealthy countries interacting with each other, the ground of common humanity does not generate an obligation to refrain from luring away capital.

What is distinctive about the ground-of-justice approach is that it allows for multiple grounds of justice with potentially different scopes and with distinct principles of justice. For example, shared citizenship (or resident-ship) is another ground of justice, giving rise to strong claims of justice among co-citizens. Being subject to the global trade system again generates specific claims of justice. So in principle, the grounds-of-justice approach provides the resources for developing an argument that a particular ground of justice generates claims of justice to support fiscal autonomy even among rich countries. While we are skeptical that such a ground exists, one way of further working out the normative underpinnings of Dietsch's argument would be to identify the relevant ground and show that it gives rise to principles of justice along the lines of the membership principle and the fiscal policy constraint. As the argument stands, however, we are not convinced that in general, citizens in state A have claims of justice towards citizens of state B that would require that citizens of state B adjust their fiscal policies in such a way that citizens of state A can determine the size of the public budget relative to GDP and the level of redistribution in accordance with the democratic preferences of their citizens.

Endorsing the more modest position supported by the argument from common humanity that rich states should not lure away capital from poor states if that hampers their institutional development also renders superfluous any references to the intentions of states in setting tax rates. We raised some problems concerning the appeal to intentions above. According to Dietsch's position, it is problematic, for instance, that business relocates from Sweden to the UK only if the aggregate fiscal self-determination goes down and the UK had the strategic intention to lure away capital from other countries, including Sweden. In contrast, according to Dietsch, it would not be wrong for the UK to attract capital from Sweden if the UK had an authentic desire to change the fiscal environment, and then some businesses in Sweden also found that attractive. But once we accept the authentic formation of the collective will as a crucial criterion (and have no objections against the authentic exercise of the collective will bringing down the aggregate level of fiscal self-determination), whether the collective intends to adjust tax rates no longer matters. On the account just developed, considerations about intentions drop out. All that matters is whether the UK interferes with the institutional development of poor or significantly poorer countries.

1 Miriam Ronzoni (2009). "The Global Order: A Case of Background Injustice? A Practice-Dependent Account." Philosophy and Public Affairs 37 (3), pp. 229-256.

2 Mathias Risse (2012). On Global Justice. Princeton University Press. Cf. especially chapter 4.