Categorical Principles of Law: A Counterpoint to Modernity

Placeholder book cover

Hoffe, Otfried, Categorical Principles of Law: A Counterpoint to Modernity, Translated by Mark Migotti, Penn State University Press, 2002, 341pp, $26.50 (pbk), ISBN 0271021594.

Reviewed by Patrick Kain, Purdue University/ Philips-Universitat, Marburg


Many supporters and critics of “modernity” have proceeded with an inadequate understanding of Kant’s political philosophy. In this collection of thematically linked essays (some new, others revised for the occasion), Otfried Höffe, one of Europe’s leading political philosophers and interpreters of Kant’s practical philosophy, offers a powerful apology for the revival of a more authentically Kantian foundation for contemporary social and political philosophy and for the more nuanced understanding of modernity such a revival would bring. Höffe insists that modernity be understood, from its origins, as a “polyphonic” composition, with Kant’s voice providing the necessary counterpoint to the legitimate, yet exaggerated strains of modernity’s prima donnas, empiricism and pluralism (4). [Contrary to the translation of the subtitle, Kantianism is a counterpoint within modernity.] There is a positive and negative side to Höffe’s thesis. On the positive side, Höffe contends that there is a rather compelling justification for Kant’s categorical imperative and the “categorical principles of law” that follow from it, such as the human rights widely recognized in the modern world. The justificatory refrain is “practical metaphysics plus [moral] anthropology” (9, 93, 99). On the negative side, Höffe alleges, neither contemporary legal theory, given its empirical-pragmatic bias, nor contemporary social theory, given its uncritical obsession with radical pluralism, can justify such categorical principles.

The book is divided into three parts. Part One provides an interpretation of and apology for Kant’s “Categorical Imperative of Law (in the singular),” i.e., “act in the external world in such a way that the free use of your voluntary agency is consistent with the freedom of all according to a universal law” (94). Höffe defends this moral principle against claims that it is insufficiently “critical” (ch. 2), objectionably “moralistic” (ch. 3), and indefensibly “metaphysical” and/or abstract (ch.4). Part Two is primarily concerned with several applications of this categorical principle. It begins with a critique of utilitarian attempts to accommodate “the justice objection” (ch. 6) and proceeds to offer an interpretation and partial defense of Kant’s arguments for the prohibition against false promising, against charges of “rigorism” (ch. 7); for the legitimacy of retributive punishment, against its complete dismissal (ch. 8); and for an international confederation of nations, against charges of utopianism (ch. 9). Here the arguments proceed via insightful exegesis, analysis, and reconstruction of key passages from Mill’s Utilitarianism, and Kant’s Groundwork, Doctrine of Right, and “Perpetual Peace” essay, respectively. Especially in this section, Höffe’s defenses of Kant are only partial: he sets aside several of Kant’s more extreme and controversial conclusions, for example, that specific moral principles do not allow exceptions even in cases of moral conflict or that criminal punishment is obligatory and should strive for a literal “eye for an eye” and eschew consideration of the subjective elements of crimes. Part Three extends and clarifies several elements of the account (and that offered in Political Justice [1987, trans. 1995]) through critical reviews of the attempts by Axelrod (ch. 10), Rawls (ch. 11), Apel (ch.12) and Habermas (ch. 13) to do without some or all of the core elements of the Kantian account.

The book succeeds at “presenting a conceptual profile” of the Kantian “counterpoint” and “examining its validity” (4). It lays out a provocative and ambitious agenda for Kantian political philosophy in conversation with Adorno, Apel, Axelrod, Habermas, Hegel, Kelsen, Lübbe, Luhmann, Marquard, Mill, Rawls, Scheler, and others; includes stimulating interpretations and reconstructions of several important Kantian texts; and contains several brief, yet helpful, excursions into the history of political philosophy, law, and social theory. Given its scope and construction, the whole and its parts will be of significant interest to a wide-range of readers (and potentially useful in a variety of seminars, especially given Kenneth Baynes helpful eighteen page foreword.) Given its programmatic nature, there are many nits left to be picked, arguments requiring further development, and responses to be considered. It would be a mistake, especially thirteen years after its original publication (Kategorische Rechtsprinzipien: ein Kontrapunkt der Moderne. Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1990) to consider this collection as the last word on modernity, contemporary political philosophy, or even Kant’s place within it. A thorough critical evaluation would have to examine Höffe’s prolific attempts, over the last two decades, to defend and further develop various aspects of this project. Such an examination is certainly beyond the scope of the present review. But it is possible to provide a brief, provisional assessment of Höffe’s Kant interpretation, the strength of his philosophical case, and of the accuracy of this English translation.

The core of Höffe’s proposal emerges in response to the charges that Kant “moralizes politics” and relies upon dubious “metaphysical abstraction.” Höffe responds to the familiar complaint that Kant “moralizes politics” by distinguishing between three (or four) different levels of analysis and argumentation and between two different domains of application. “First moral philosophy” or “Fundamental Ethics” begins with a semantic account of the concept of morality, the idea of the “unconditioned good” and categorically binding claims, and proceeds to derive a general normative criterion of morality, the categorical imperative and its demand for “universalizability,” from this concept. This first moral philosophy, according to Höffe, is common to ethics and political philosophy. “Second moral philosophy” is concerned with the application of this general criterion to two different domains: on the one hand, “law and right” [Recht], concerned with law and external action; and on the other, ethics, concerned with individual virtue [Tugend] or “morality” in the more familiar sense. Within each domain, there are two stages of application. At the “general” or “intermediate” stage of application, a single highest principle is identified for each domain (“The Categorical Imperative of Law [in the singular]”(quoted above) and “The Categorical Imperative of Virtue [in the singular]”, respectively). At the “special” stage of application, substantive categorical principles are derived, within each domain, from the relevant principle (5-7). The distinction between the domains of “external” and “internal freedom” within Kant’s unified theory, Höffe argues, is what supports Kant’s political anti-moralization thesis, the “morality of law without moralizing”: (8, 55) state authority can be morally legitimate and is obliged to recognize human rights, but public authorities ought neither demand that individuals comply with the law out of a “sense of duty,” nor attempt to legislate all of morality.

Höffe responds to the charges of metaphysical excess and hopeless abstraction with the slogan “practical metaphysics plus anthropology,” which involves two theses. The integral anthropology thesis maintains (in this case explicitly contra some of Kant’s own excessive programmatic assertions) that, at the fundamental, general and special levels of analysis and within each domain of application, the metaphysical demand for “universality” is and must be paired with a “moral anthropology” which identifies the conditions of application for the relevant universal principle (8-9). The thesis of metaphysical modesty maintains that the metaphysical demand, especially the part of it specific to “The Categorical Imperative of Law,” amounts to a “practical” rather than a “theoretical metaphysics” and may require neither full-blown transcendental idealism nor, anthropologically, even absolute “freedom of the will.” This more modest metaphysics is constituted by the unconditional demand for “universalizability” or reciprocity applied to a more limited conception of “freedom of action”(50, 87-88, 92-93). Especially at the “special” level of application within the domain of right, Höffe argues, the more or less plausible and increasingly concrete anthropology keeps Kant’s theory in contact with the concrete and empirical.

Many aspects of this conception have proven themselves quite promising in the recent Kant literature, and in this context Höffe’s interpretive contributions remain stimulating. In particular, the significance (and contested status) Höffe ascribes to the “moral anthropology” within Kant’s moral and political philosophy is beginning to be explored quite fruitfully in recent work by Felicitas Munzel, Robert Louden, Allen Wood, and others. Similarly, Höffe draws our attention to the significance of several Kantian distinctions for liberal political theory: the distinction between justice and virtue, the difference between rights and benevolence (both fruitfully explored, for example, in Onora O’Neill’s Toward Justice and Virtue), and the distinct ways in which the legitimation of state authority can be related to justifications of a welfare state. Höffe’s reconstruction of Kant’s “false promising” example and his proposals for a Kantian approach to moral dilemmas are worth considering alongside some of Barbara Herman’s work. (Can Höffe’s approach be extended to cover all perfect and imperfect duties?)

Some will remain unconvinced of Höffe’s central philosophical contention that non-Kantian attempts to ground or account for “categorical principles of law” are doomed to failure, and that a “transcendental” grounding focused on Kantian “universalizability” will succeed. On the negative side, Höffe provides a number of arguments which suggest that familiar pragmatic-empiricist attempts to ground these principles rely on dubious premises and amount to, at best, contingent defenses of what appear to be necessary principles. These arguments, even if compelling, do leave one free to abandon the alleged categorical necessity of the principles rather than the commitment to empiricism. Moreover, even if one concedes that the principles do require a non-empirical, “metaphysical” grounding, we receive only a “sketch” of some of the key arguments, especially those devoted to grounding the Kantian “first moral philosophy” (76, 183). Without taking anything away from the contribution here, it is important to note that it constitutes a strong apology but not a decisive positive argument.

I would suggest that, in the final analysis, the requisite Kantian argument for the unconditional moral authority of the categorical principles of law may entail some qualification of both the metaphysical modesty thesis and the anti-moralization thesis. Recall Höffe’s contention that, in conjunction with the anti-moralization thesis, Kant’s “philosophy of law and right … dispenses with the freedom of the will” (50). To be sure, there is an important sense in which the content of Kant’s philosophy of law focuses upon external freedom of action rather than autonomous or virtuous motivation (87): the criteria for distinguishing between just and unjust claims, laws, and regimes do not refer to the autonomy or heteronomy manifested by the relevant parties. And, it may also be that, under certain empirical conditions, self-interest will supply everyone with reasons to comply with the demands of Kantian justice, in which case autonomous motivation would be unnecessary (51-52). In at least two respects, however, the normative authority of the categorical principles of right may require more “practical metaphysics” (or metaphysical “moral anthropology”) than is immediately apparent.

On Höffe’s account, the categorical principle(s) of law are moral principles: they articulate an unconditional supra-positive norm, in the first instance, for states, “juridical orders” or “social conditions,” rather than for individuals (31-32, 40, 54). The presuppositions of the first moral philosophy that Höffe would have ground this norm is unclear. Why ought states be concerned with or aspire to the idea of this “unconditionally good social order”? Höffe may be correct that some normative standard is essential to distinguishing between a legal order and a criminal enterprise or “mere structure of power relations,” perhaps even that the norm must require that “at least in certain cases, those subject to the force of the law are also those that benefit by it” (46). The justification for the specifically Kantian demand that legal institutions provide, at the fundamental level, an equal benefit to each (rather than merely some benefit to each or a merely collective benefit), seems to be grounded in the claim that objective normative judgment can only be completed in an absolutely “unconditioned” principle (76, 79, 108, 221). But this regress argument to the unconditioned principle may turn out, when elaborated, to presuppose that the “judges,” those participating in, exercising, and subject to state authority or reflection upon it, are autonomous rational beings.

A similar conclusion emerges if we consider the normative status that the categorical principles of right have for the actions of individuals. There is some ambiguity in Kant’s (and thus Höffe’s) account about whether the concept of right should include any unconditional demand for “juridical legality,” i.e., an unconditional and supra-positive demand that individuals act (from some motive or another) in compliance with the fundamental demands of right. On the one hand, Kant may seem to suggest that right only commands compliance when there is an empirical motivation ( [6:218,230]; cf. 50, 56, 67, 92). On the other hand, Kant claims, for example, that right requires that all individuals who can enter into the civil condition ought to ([6:306] cf. 94, 127-8, 178). Regardless of how this question is resolved, there seems to be a dilemma. If absolute “juridical legality” is not part of right, then within the theory of right, human rights seem to be less than categorical. To sustain its categoricity, one would have to invoke ethics, which requires juridical legality as a presupposition of “juridical morality,” but would thereby be drawing on the stronger metaphysical assumptions of ethics. If juridical legality is considered part of right, its absoluteness would entail that right presuppose that there is always a motive to comply with its demands. Right would need to presuppose either that people have a capacity to be motivated by “duty” when self-interested motivation is lacking (presupposing “freedom of the will”), or it would need to presuppose that there is, as Kant thought, a providential “coincidence” between enlightened self-interest and the demands of right that holds for all of its subjects (51, 193-4). Either way, the categorical demand for “juridical legality” requires a substantial “metaphysical” assumption.

Höffe is correct that in this context we may leave open the question of whether the “practical metaphysics” is best defended with or without appeal to other aspects of Kant’s philosophical system (64, 77). My critical philosophical suggestion, however, prepared by Höffe’s own insightful analysis, is that, in spite of the important distinction between the domains of right and virtue, the normativity of Kantian categorical principles of right, for both the state and the individual, may depend upon a bit more “moralizing” of politics and/or a bit more of the more demanding “practical metaphysics” (or metaphysical anthropology) associated with Kantian morality than may be explicitly acknowledged here or in Kant’s texts.

The translation of the German word “Recht” and its relatives is the source of many difficulties and controversies, as English-speakers familiar with Kant’s political philosophy are well aware. Some awkwardness or confusion is unavoidable. The translator’s choice to switch between “law and right,” “law,” and “right,” and their cognates, and late in the book to switch intentionally, yet suddenly and inexplicably, to “Recht” may strike some as less than ideal (227, cf. xxxvi). Höffe’s phrase “morality of law without moralizing” hints at two related challenges: within Kant’s theory “morality” (and its relatives) sometimes seem to refer to both ethics and political philosophy, other times only to ethics; and within ethics, Kant draws a motivational distinction between “morality” and mere “legality,” the latter of which can be easily confused with the “legality” and laws discussed in political philosophy. To avoid confusion, a translation of a contemporary work needs to adopt (even interpolate, if necessary) and strictly adhere to some technical terminology; variation can seem to suggest unintended distinctions. Somewhat unfortunately, this translation seems to vary its technical interpolations as the book progresses: at different points in the book, for example, the ethical subdomain and/or its special motive are identified in terms of “moral worth,” “moral goodness,” “moral autonomy,” “strict morality,” “ethics proper,” and “full blown” or “full fledged morality.” [The frequent interpolation of “strict” morality (50f, 130) is potentially confusing since Höffe himself uses a different “strict” sense in another passage (221).] On some occasions, technical terms are also misused (e.g. Rawls’s “original situation”[220], “division of powers” rather than “separation of powers”[79-80, 186, 277]). Other mistranslations mistakenly suggest interpretive or philosophical errors, e.g., the assertion that happiness (rather than happiness in proportion to virtue) is the complete good (246); or the running of the same transcendental argument in opposite directions (76). This translation also drops, for no obvious reason, a number of in-text citations and cross-references, and drops (inconsistently) the original’s helpful use of italics to highlight organizational cues. Nonetheless, the present translation manages, by and large, to make this interesting and important work available, at last, to English-speaking readers. For this we should be grateful.