Categories for the Working Philosopher

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Elaine Landry (ed.), Categories for the Working Philosopher, Oxford University Press, 2017, 471pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198748991.

Reviewed by Alberto Peruzzi, Università di Firenze


This book consists of 18 chapters by leading scholars and provides a valuable resource for the growing community of researchers interested in the use of the language and the theoretical tools provided by category theory (hereafter, CT). As if to mimic its own content, it is more than a set of papers under a common name (for a sufficiently wide subject or project). It is a category of papers, with morphisms between them, and in certain respects it is also different from a typical collective tree-handbook with chapter n+1 depending on some or all of the previous n chapters, but never vice versa (indeed, the very notion of category, used in the first chapters, is defined in succeeding chapters). Each chapter is such a rich source of knowledge that it deserves a review as long as the present one, for, while providing essential information on specific topics, each is more than just a survey of well-established contents: it offers a key for their unification, guides the reader through recent research, and investigates issues at the frontiers of mathematical knowledge which are relevant for applications to various scientific domains. There is a vivid sense of unity among most chapters as tiles of one work in progress, having importance for mathematics, logic and philosophy, even though, as one might expect, chapters differ in their emphasis on basic principles or approach them from different angles.

In the light of all this, it is impossible to go into the details of each chapter in a review of this length. Thus, this review will provide general information on the book's contents, even though this will not do justice to the many original details to be found in most chapters, and just a few brief concluding comments on themes recurring throughout the book.

The chapters deal with different aspects of CT in relation to many topics and are linked to each other by one primary, often explicit, "theme", namely, to describe the benefits resulting from the use of CT and to explain why they are benefits, either through indispensability arguments, or in terms of conceptual economy. This latter line of argument leads to a second "theme", present in many chapters, in which a structuralist perspective on mathematics is identified, intended to capture the philosophical meaning of CT or to exploit CT in promoting such a perspective, or both (e.g., the papers by Colin McLarty, Michael Ernst, and Jean-Pierre Marquis).

Although some papers do not enter into, at least explicitly, the philosophical issues involved in the adoption of such a perspective (e.g., Kohei Kishida on categorical modal logic), certain papers do so without reserve and provide core arguments in support (Steve Awodey). In some cases such arguments are also put to use in applying CT to specific problems of physical theories (Bob Coecke and Aleks Kissinger on quantum theory and, James Owen Weatherall on classical space-time theories). The paper by Hans Halvorson and Dimitris Tsementzis on philosophy of physics deserves special mention because it shows how the resources of CT allow one to refine in an essential way the notion of "equivalence" for empirical theories, resolving a longstanding debate concerning logical empiricism. On the other hand, some authors are more cautious or avoid commitment because their focus is a particular subject with no direct ex pede Herculem in sight.

Even independently of a detailed characterisation of such a structuralist perspective, however, the book offers a wide, deep and extremely useful source of information on the state of the art, something which has long been needed and which will remain an indispensable reference.

The chapters can be divided into three main groups, with relevant links to each other, corresponding to three different topics: the meaning of CT for the foundations of mathematics (ch. 1-6), the relationships between CT and logic (ch. 7-11), the application of CT to physics and the relevance of CT for philosophy of physics and more generally for philosophy of science (ch. 12-18, with ch. 15, by Andrée Ehresmann, providing an opening to biology and the cognitive sciences).


This section begins with the presentation by McLarty of how the notion of set differs in ZFC and ETCS (Lawveres's Elementary Theory of the Category of Sets), and continues with David Corfield, who argues for CT and HOT as direct continuations of Klein's Erlangen Program for geometry. Essays by Michael Shulman and by Awodey are devoted to widening the categorical approach by embedding it in the perspective of Homotopy Type Theories and Univalence, along the lines of the foundational project devised by Vladimir Voevodsky.


In this section John Bell shows how CT, after Lawvere's seminal work, leads to higher-order intuitionistic logic, through the internal language of an elementary topos, while J. R. B. Cockett and R. A. G. Seely delineate the converse path for linear logic, by illustrating which kinds of category can serve as models of linearity. Marquis introduces ideas by Michael Makkai, who together with Gonzalo Reyes was instrumental in developing categorical model theory. The paper describes Makkai's formal system (FOLDS) as an extension of first order logic aimed at a better representation of abstract mathematical concepts. Kishida handles modal logics and some related topics using categorical methods, while Samson Abramsky analyzes the border-crossing notion of contextuality in terms of the local/global distinction.


Beyond the chapters already mentioned (and it must be noted that the paper by Coecke and Kissinger is in fact the first part of a volume on categorical quantum mechanics), this section offers a paper by Joachim Lambek (to whom much of categorical logic is indebted) presenting a three-dimensional time to achieve a six-dimensional Lorentz category, and a paper by David Spivak arguing for CT as a mathematical model of mathematical models. Philosophy of physics is, significantly, the subject of the last paper, in which the editor argues for a version of realism dubbed "structural realism".

This book is the first to bring CT not to logicians or physicists but to a general philosophical audience, a few remarks are in order. First, the title recalls a famous book by Saunders Mac Lane, Categories for the Working Mathematician (Springer, 1971), who in turn intended a reference to a previous paper by Nicholas Bourbaki, actually written by André Weil, entitled "Foundations of Mathematics for the Working Mathematician" (The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 14, 1949, pp. 1-8). Given this, one might expect that every field of philosophy would be to some extent taken into account. But in fact philosophy of language is only mentioned briefly and ethics and aesthetics do not figure at all. Nevertheless philosophers working in these areas will find much food for thought in this volume, if only because it invites them to raise questions which can't be discussed, or made precise, without the expressive resources provided by CT. Conversely, the import of CT for linguistics and psychology shows that structuralism has had a long history in both, and one might also consider the notion of category as instantiated within the history of philosophy (from Aristotle to Kant up to present day "system ontology"). But the book is not intended to be exhaustive and even a quick listing of contents as in the list above, already reveals plenty of aspects of philosophical relevance. In any case there is also a sense in which the gaps in the book are deceptive if one subscribes to the claim that CT has, de facto, great importance for mathematics and philosophy of mathematics and both have, de jure, a great importance for any branch of philosophy, so that the content of this book provides a heuristic lever for the "working philosopher".

Second, there is no question that the "structuralist turn" in the philosophy of mathematics has illuminated many issues which were of much concern during a century of dispute between realism and constructivism. Yet if, for any given structure S, A S B implies A =S B, there is an issue (recalling Moore's paradox of analysis) when S is the universe of discourse of the language used to make such a claim, as if there were an acquaintance with the difference, to be denied, between and =. Although the issue can be shifted up from a metalanguage to a higher one, the shift looks like a discharge of the onus towards understanding, while a virtuous holistic circle saves us from regress but looks as if it is an appeal to miracle. So there is a tension between a constructivist view such as Per Martin-Löf's, according to which what is "put in by hand" has to be taken at face value (and what is not explicitly put in is not supposed to be there, see p. 52) and the structuralist view according to which anything is taken up to isomorphism. Can the question whether the former view prevails over the latter or vice versa reduce to a matter of convention, and so as such be contingent, left to the context of use, to practical needs which change in time? If so, the outcome is rather Quinean, although Quine missed the appropriate framework for his holistic pragmatism by sticking to the notion of set rather than exploiting the notion of category. But this cannot be the expected solution if the whole project is intended to be constructive and intensional -- in an indeed wide sense, since it is generous in hosting classical and extensional parts as limit cases, and in fact the whole effort is repeated with ∞-groupoids in place of categories. In particular, if structuralism is supported by the claim that the iterative conception of set is overcome by the categorical notion of set, analogous support seems to be more problematic with the iterative hierarchy of n-types.

A third topic of discussion suggested by the book, is whether the foundations of mathematics belong or do not belong to mathematics. Twentieth century axiomatics (together with the mathematisation of logic) supports the first view. But the very term "foundations" involves a metaphor, of knowledge as a building, which can be questioned, as well as can the alternative metaphor of a "net" of structures and, perhaps, of a principled "net". The ground on which the building rests or the handholds of the net do not belong to either, and the hypothesis that the ground has the same structure as the building (or the net) is multiply ambiguous, for it lends itself to both a realistic and an idealistic reading, to a naturalistic and an anti-naturalistic philosophy.

To sum up these remarks: perhaps this book does not, in itself, provide the "working philosopher" with reasons for reading it, yet it is a book that should be recommended to any working philosopher. It is also a book excellently edited, containing both a useful name index and an extensive subject index, in addition to the rich bibliography with which each chapter is equipped.