Causal Reasoning in Physics

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Mathias Frisch, Causal Reasoning in Physics, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 256pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107031494.

Reviewed by Thomas Blanchard, Illinois Wesleyan University


Most contemporary philosophers of physics agree with Russell's (1913) view that causal notions are absent from or at least play no essential role in fundamental physics. In this book Mathias Frisch launches an incisive attack on the neo-Russellian consensus. Frisch argues that far from being 'a relic of a bygone era' (Russell's words), causal notions play a legitimate and in fact indispensable role in our best physical theories of the world.

The bulk of the book is devoted to a careful examination and criticism of the various arguments that have been offered for the claim that causation has little or no role to play in physics. One line of argument relies on the thought that causal relations essentially involve a small number of coarse-grained relata, whereas the dynamical equations of fundamental physics relate complete cross sections of lightcones specified in full microscopic detail. Another cluster of arguments relies on the influential interventionist theory of causation, and purports to show that interventionist notions of causation cannot straightforwardly be applied in certain physical contexts. Perhaps the most prominent anti-causal argument appeals to the fact that causation is asymmetric (if c causes e, e doesn't cause c), whereas the laws of physics are time-symmetric. This list of anti-causal arguments isn't exhaustive. Indeed, a nice feature of Frisch's book is that it offers a comprehensive panorama of the various anti-causal arguments scattered throughout the literature.

Frisch's first line of response against these arguments is that many of the models and inferences one finds in physics do not in fact have the features that are supposed to make them inhospitable to causal interpretation. Physical models routinely include coarse-grained variables, and they typically fall far short of specifying a complete cross section of the backward lightcone of the spacetime region under investigation. (In most cases, such a specification would be far too complex for us to handle.) One example that Frisch examines in detail is the model of the proton beam in the LHC at CERN. As Frisch points out, the model doesn't proceed by representing the microstate of the world in an entire cross-section of the backward lightcone of the protons' trajectories. Instead, many influences on the beam are simply not represented, because they are insignificant enough to be safely ignored, or they are represented in a coarse-grained way. For instance, the bending magnets that keep the beam on its trajectory are modeled macroscopically. Moreover, Frisch points out that inferences routinely made by physicists are justified by time-asymmetric causal assumptions. For instance, imagine observing a point of light in the sky. On what ground are we justified in inferring that the light was emitted by a star rather than its being source-free radiation? The inference doesn't proceed by plugging final conditions into electrodynamic laws; to do so we would need complete information about the present cross section of the forward lightcone of the region of interest, an enormously large area. Instead, the inference is justified on the basis of a common cause principle. We are justified in positing the existence of the star because the correlations between our observations of light points at different times and in different places would be radically improbable if the light points in question were not the products of a common cause (i.e., if they were not produced by a single star). Frisch shows that similar causal inferences play a central role in linear dispersion theory and electromagnetism: physicists tend to privilege retarded to advanced solutions to the equations of these theories on the ground that advanced solutions violate some time-asymmetric principle of causality.

This response to anti-causal arguments convincingly shows that causal talk and principles are much more present in certain areas of physics than neo-Russellians have tended to acknowledge. But as Frisch recognizes, this isn't enough to show that neo-Russellianism is wrongheaded. Many neo-Russellians happily grant that causal notions and assumptions have a role to play in applied physics; what they deny is that causal relations are part of the fundamental physical structure of the world. (For instance, this seems to be the view of Hitchcock 2007 and Woodward 2007). On their view, causal notions may be useful in non-fundamental physics, but a complete physical model of the universe includes only two sorts of things: complete physical states of the world at a time and symmetric laws constraining how those states evolve. There is no reason to posit fundamental causal relations as an additional ingredient. Indeed, Frisch's examination of model building and inference in physics may seem to provide additional motivation for this view, as it suggests that the usefulness of causal notions and inferences in physics stems from our epistemic limitations -- namely, our ignorance of the exact initial conditions of the systems under investigation. If we could specify those conditions in complete detail and plug them into the dynamical equations of fundamental physics, the thought goes, there would be no need for us to represent the physical world in causal terms.

Frisch offers several lines of response to this objection. First, he argues against a basic presupposition of neo-Russellianism, viz. that our best physical theories yield complete models of the universe from which one can read off the fundamental physical structure of the world. In chapter 2, Frisch offers a pragmatic theory of scientific representation according to which a physical model represents a phenomenon only if it is used as a representation of the phenomenon. Since a complete physical model of the universe would be too complex for us to grasp, it follows from this account that our physical theories do not represent the universe as a whole. The implications of this account of scientific representation for neo-Russellianism are not entirely clear to me, however. The reason is that neo-Russellianism is primarily a thesis about the metaphysical structure of the world, but Frisch says little about the metaphysical consequences of his theory of scientific representation, or even whether it is supposed to have any metaphysical implications. If it does, then the picture of the world it suggests is a 'dappled', Cartwrightian one, on which laws of nature do not have universal scope and causal capacities are primary. This picture of the world is certainly incompatible with neo-Russellianism. But if Frisch means to defend this metaphysical option, he owes us a response to the standard objections against it, such as Hoefer's (2003) argument that we are warranted in ascribing universal scope to the laws on grounds of simplicity. If Frisch's account of scientific representation is supposed to be compatible with the thesis that physical laws (conceived as real entities in the world) have universal scope, then it seems to me that at least some of the standard anti-causal arguments still stand. For instance, if the symmetric laws discovered by physics have universal scope, we have good reasons to believe that the evolution of our world is not driven by time-asymmetric causal relations, even if we cannot construct complete physical representations of how the world evolves under the laws.

Be that as it may, Frisch proposes another line of response that doesn't rely on his account of scientific representation. There Frisch grants for the sake of the argument that our physical theories do provide us with complete microscopic models of the universe. But, he argues, these models give us good reasons to posit causal relations at the fundamental physical level.

Frisch has two tasks to accomplish here. The first is to show that we can make sense of the idea of fundamental physical causation, since various anti-causal arguments purport to show that causal notions cannot be meaningfully applied at the level of fundamental physics. By and large, Frisch's responses to these arguments are very convincing. Chapter 3 offers an excellent response to the argument that causal relations essentially involve coarse-grained relata and thus cannot hold between the fine-grained variables one finds in microscopic models of the universe. Chapter 4 examines a cluster of arguments purporting to show that on an interventionist conception of causation, complete models of the universe as a whole are not amenable to causal interpretation. Frisch convincingly shows that the conditions for something to count as an intervention can be relaxed in a way that blocks many of those arguments.

I was less convinced by Frisch's response to the interventionist 'open-systems' argument. The open-systems argument relies on the idea that interventions into a system are exogenous physical processes coming from outside the system. But global states of the world have no 'outside' from which interventions could originate. This makes it hard to interpret the global states of the world represented by complete models of the universe as standing in causal relations to one another. As Judea Pearl puts it, 'if you wish to include the whole universe in the model, causality disappears because interventions disappear' (2000, 350). Frisch's response is that even if a system doesn't have an outside from which a physical intervention can be performed, the interventionist formalism can still be coherently applied to the system in question. Suppose one postulates causal relations from earlier to later global states of the world and represents them by structural equations expressing the dependency of a global state of the world on some earlier state. Then formally an intervention on a variable X representing possible states of the universe at a time consists in removing the equation expressing the dependence of X on earlier states and replacing it with an equation that sets X at some forced value x. The causal consequences of X=x can then be determined by evolving the relevant state of the world forward via the dynamical laws. This procedure is well-defined even if we do not interpret it as representing a physical process of intervention on the universe as a whole. Thus Frisch concludes that we can coherently regard global states of the world as causally efficacious in an interventionist framework.

However, since in this procedure 'interventions' on global states of the world are not understood as concrete physical manipulations, I do not find this manoeuver very convincing. As I understand it, the open systems argument claims that (a) it is in the nature of a causal relation that it can be exploited by an exogenous physical manipulation of the cause and (b) global states of the universe cannot be subjected (even in principle) to exogenous physical manipulations. The fact that Pearl's formalism can coherently be applied to global models of the universe if we do not interpret them as representing physical manipulations is not an answer to the open systems argument interpreted in this way. It seems to me that a better way to go for Frisch would be to insist that interventionism is limited in scope: it sheds light on high-level causal claims, but has difficulties capturing fundamental causal relations. As long as there are good independent reasons to posit relations of asymmetric dependence in fundamental physics, this seems to me an appropriate way for anti-Russellians to react to the open systems argument.

The second task for Frisch is precisely to show that there is a theoretical payoff to positing primitive causal relations in physics. (Even if one can make sense of primitive causal relations at a fundamental physical level, this doesn't yet show that we have good reasons to do so.) On his view, positing a primitive causal arrow is required in order to explain a certain pervasive probabilistic asymmetry between initial and final conditions of physical systems. In our world final conditions tend to exhibit fine correlations; for instance, the outgoing waves originating from a broadcast antenna are finely correlated with one another. By contrast, we never observe finely correlated incoming waves converging onto an antenna. More generally, the initial conditions of a system's components are usually distributed at random, but their final conditions are not. Frisch argues that this asymmetry of randomness cries out for explanation, and that a primitive causal asymmetry is the best explanation for it. The explanation goes like this. Correlations between states of a system's subcomponents are extremely unlikely in the absence of a common cause of those states, and causes lie in the past rather than the future of their effects. Since final conditions of physical systems lie in the causal future of the system, they will typically exhibit fine correlations; but the initial conditions of those systems will not.

I have two worries here. First, it is not clear to me that a primitive causal asymmetry is the only possible explanation of the asymmetry of randomness between systems' initial and final conditions. Perhaps the asymmetry can be traced back to the fact that the universe itself began in a random initial condition, in a way that parallels the Boltzmannian explanation of the asymmetry of entropy increase in terms of a low-entropy initial condition of the universe. (Of course one might ask why the world began in such an initial random state, but arguably initial conditions of the universe are not the sort of thing that need to be explained -- they are more appropriately regarded as brute facts.) If this works, we would have no reason to posit a primitive causal arrow, as long as the familiar temporal asymmetries between causes and effects can themselves be explained in terms of this initial condition of the universe. Admittedly this is no mean feat, and in chapter 8 Frisch offers an incisive criticism of the most popular attempt, due to David Albert and Barry Loewer, to ground the causal asymmetry in certain features of the universe's initial state. Albert and Loewer are not trying to ground the causal asymmetry directly in an asymmetry of initial randomness: they take a detour by trying to reduce the causal arrow to a thermodynamic arrow first. It is with that step of their reduction that Frisch takes issue. As Frisch himself notes (233), the prospects for a direct reduction of the causal arrow to an asymmetry of initial randomness are more promising.

My second worry is this. Frisch's primitive causal asymmetry seems at least as much in need of explanation as the asymmetry of randomness it supposedly explains. For instance, why is this causal arrow oriented from past to future and not in the reverse direction? As Frisch recognizes (162), the fact that causes can precede their effects cannot be a conceptual necessity since we can make sense of backward causation. Moreover, Frisch's explanation of the asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions relies on the principle that the initial states of a system's subcomponents usually do not have a common cause. (This is needed to get the result that typically these subcomponents are uncorrelated.) One may well insist that this fact itself calls for explanation. In general, the explanatory demands raised by Frisch's primitive causal arrow seem no less urgent than the one raised by the asymmetry of randomness. In light of this, it is not clear why positing a primitive causal asymmetry should be more theoretically beneficial than simply taking the asymmetry between random initial conditions and correlated final conditions as a brute fact.

Whether Frisch's argument for fundamental causation succeeds is debatable, but Causal Reasoning in Physics is nevertheless an impressive and important book. It constitutes a detailed and comprehensive panorama of the recent literature on causation in physics, provides many interesting criticisms of popular anti-causal arguments, and offers a thought-provoking alternative to the prevalent neo-Russellian view. Frisch's book will be required reading for anyone interested in causation and its role in physics.


Hitchcock, C. (2007). What Russell Got Right. In Price, H. and Corry, R. (eds.), Causation, Physics, and the Constitution of Reality: Russell's Republic Revisited. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 45-65.

Hoefer, C. (2003). For Fundamentalism. Philosophy of Science. 70(5), 1401-1412.

Pearl, J. (2000). Causality: Models, Reasoning and Inference. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Russell, B. (1913). On the Notion of Cause. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society. 13, 1-26.

Woodward, J. (2007). Causation with a Human Face. In Price, H. and Corry, R. (eds.), Causation, Physics, and the Constitution of Reality: Russell's Republic Revisited. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 66-105.