Causality, Probability, and Medicine

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Donald Gillies, Causality, Probability, and Medicine, Routledge, 2019, 300pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138829282.

Reviewed by Federica Russo, University of Amsterdam


This book is at the crossroads of the philosophy of medicine, philosophy of causality, and philosophy of mechanisms. Specifically, it contributes to understanding the philosophical and historical underpinnings of medical methodology. Donald Gillies' aim in the book is to "develop a theory of causality for theoretical medicine".  In order to establish a link between causality and probability, Gillies shows that we have to link causality and action on the one hand, and causality and mechanisms on the other.

Admittedly, it is a rather difficult task to contribute simultaneously to these intricately interconnected issues that are the focus of a number of debates. Gillies does succeed in showing how in-depth analysis of history of medicine can shed light on theoretical issues in philosophy of causality and probability, and on contemporary discussions of the methods of medicine, broadly construed. In this book, he develops a theory of causality, in which mechanisms, probability, and causality are woven together.

The book is organised thematically, with a clearly structured argument. Part I discusses the relations between causality and action. Part II explores the relations between causality and mechanisms. Part III continues investigating the relations between causality and probability, effectively going back to one of the oldest topics to which Gillies has made significant contributions, namely probability theory. There are also two Appendices, providing the mathematical and statistical details of the theorems discussed.

In the Introduction, Gillies establishes boundaries. To begin with, distinguishing between theoretical and clinical medicine, he makes clear that he will be concerned with the former but not with the latter. (Theoretical medicine, broadly construed, is where laws and theories about health and disease are formulated and tested, and where causal claims are established.) Then he turns to making some clarifications about causality. The causal claims made in theoretical medicine are generic, rather than single-case. So, for instance, to borrow Gillies' very first example, "The varicella zoster virus (VZV) causes chickenpox" is a generic claim because it applies or occurs in many cases. In clinical medicine, instead, doctors are confronted with diagnoses and prognoses about specific, individual patients, and so they are mostly concerned with establishing, e.g., that John is affected by chickenpox, which is caused by VZV, as evidenced by his latest blood tests. The type of causal claims Gillies is interested in are also typically indeterministic in character, namely even if it is true that smoking causes lung cancer, it is not the case that every smoker will develop cancer, or that all lung cancer cases are caused by smoking. The other important characteristic of causal claims in theoretical medicine is that they have to do with action. His 'action-related' theory of causality is developed, in Part I, for deterministic cases and, in Part III, for indeterministic cases. In the remainder of the Introduction, Gillies provides brief introductions to mechanistic theories and to probabilistic theories of causality. On these two issues, his view is that we should characterize mechanisms in terms of causes, rather than the other way round, as is often the case in the literature, and that probabilities are to be interpreted as propensities.

Part I presents Gillies' 'action-related' theory of causality. This is presented in two theoretical chapters, drawing on his classic 2005 paper "An action-related theory of causality". Briefly put, Gillies' view is that "causal laws are useful and appropriate in situations where there is a close link between the law and action based on the law" (p.24). To make his point, he takes us through a journey that begins as early as Russell's critique of causation (the famous view that causality is like monarchy, namely a "relic of a bygone age") and that revives the insightful view of authors such as Collingwood and Gasking, the thinkers pioneering the relations between causality and action in the 1940-50s. The third chapter of this first part applies the theoretical framework previously developed to an example from history of medicine, namely how Koch managed to isolate the bacterium responsible for tuberculosis and the one that causes cholera.

Part II has a more complex argument structure, in part because the literatures it engages with are themselves very large, fast-growing, and span scientific fields beyond that of medicine. Gillies' strategy is to introduce the relations between causality and mechanisms by explaining how the debate in fact originates in a criticism of the process theory of causality developed by Salmon (1984) and Dowe (2000). In particular, Gillies discusses the definitions of mechanism given in an early paper of Glennan's (1996) and in the classic contribution of Machamer, Darden, and Craver (2000). For the non-expert reader, it is perhaps worth noting that the philosophy of mechanisms has had extensive debates to establish a kind of 'consensus' definition. At the moment the Glennan-Illari definition, according to which "A mechanism for a phenomenon consists of entities (or parts) whose activities and interactions are organized so as to be responsible for the phenomenon" (Glennan and Illari 2017, 2) is the one that best captures the essential aspects of various accounts.

The next step is to introduce evidential pluralism, the view that to establish causal relations in medicine one needs evidence of correlation and evidence of mechanisms. Instead of presenting the view starting from the seminal paper of Russo and Williamson (2007), in which the 'Russo-Williamson Thesis' (RWT), was first formulated, Gillies selects two case studies from the recent history of medicine. First, he takes us through the studies on cardiovascular diseases, and particularly about how Anitschkow experimentally studied atherosclerosis in rabbits. This is meant to illustrate how evidence of mechanism is often reconstructed from (animal) experiments, although of course this is not ipso facto a guarantee of the quality of such evidence. In fact, Gillies presents a number of objections to the assumption that the way atherosclerosis works in rabbits may be a good model for human beings. Second, he reconstructs Ancel Keys' studies of saturated fat, particularly the development of 'The seven countries studies'. This illustrates how good quality statistical evidence can be obtained from observational studies (interventionist, statistical evidence is instead typically obtained from randomized controlled trials). At this point Gillies is ready to present RWT. Gillies himself contributed to clarifying the thesis, in his 2011 paper. His main point was about the status of mechanistic evidence, which doesn't have to be confirmed but can, as a minimum, be plausible. The EBM+ consortium has adopted the nuance of Gillies' version. RWT, and more generally evidential pluralism, have been investigated in the context of contemporary medical practices (see Parkkinen et al 2018), while Gillies has systematically explored how the thesis helps make sense of paradigmatic cases in history of medicine: early trials on streptomycin, McArdle disease, and the Semmelweis case. All in all, Part II manages to establish a link between causality and mechanisms, within the context of evidential pluralism, which is indeed an objective of the volume.

Part III is about probabilistic causality, a classic topic in philosophy of causality. But Gillies takes quite an interesting approach to it. First, he presents the case of cervical cancer to explain the sense in which the type of causality involved here is indeterministic or probabilistic in character. His discussion reaches back to the seminal contributions of I.J. Good in the 1960s. But, more interestingly, Gillies takes issue with one of the most popular approaches in formal methods: causal networks, and especially Pearl's Bayesian Net approach. Simply put, Gillies' view is that Pearl's formalism is not a suitable formal language to express the kind of (probabilistic) laws theoretical medicine deals with. Standard causal networks have, in fact, a hard time mathematically treating a situation that is ubiquitous in medicine: the multi-factorial character of diseases. The solution he designed, in collaboration with Aidan Sudbury, is to develop "non-Markovian" approaches. The result is not merely technical (as explained in Appendix 2), but deeply conceptual since it has to do with how we can conceptualise diseases (multifactorialism), and on this very basis develop appropriate modelling techniques for data analysis. Gillies' views contrast with those of Pearl, a disagreement they apparently have neither resolved nor acknowledged.

This book brings together Gillies' thinking, collaborations, and production spanning a bit over two decades. Despite the long time span, one can see how these ideas have internal consistency and are part of his ability to bring together in a controlled way debates as vast as causality, mechanisms, and probability. Gillies does so with his usual clarity in defining concepts, in reconstructing complex historical cases, and in identifying the critical points in open debates. The accessibility of his writing is a clear advantage, especially for non-specialists readers (whether from philosophy or from medicine) becoming interested in these debates. Occasionally, this comes at the expenses of thoroughness -- for instance one may object that his choice of limiting the discussion to Glennan and Machamer, Darden, and Craver in chapter 4 doesn't do justice to the many valuable contributions in the field, and to the subtleties that underlie the difficulty in reaching consensus about the definition of mechanisms.

All in all, this a fine volume in history and philosophy of science, particularly philosophy of medicine, one in which historical scholarship and careful reconstruction of historical cases is used to aid discussion of issues that are highly theoretical in character. Gillies is certainly very well versed in this approach, and his attention to history has been an invaluable contribution to the EBM+ consortium, whose roots, as he reminds us, are to be found in informal workshops between its Kent and University College London members more than a decade ago. His book is an important addition to the literature for several reasons. One is that Gillies, at least in my view, manages to show how theoretical debates such as those concerning the nature of causation and its relation to mechanisms and probability can use historical scholarship to great advantage. Contemporary problems (such as those around the status of evidence-based medicine) have a history -- no matter how recent. Understanding how ideas, concepts, and methods have developed over time produces better quality discussions of current problems. Another is that good history and philosophy of science (and philosophy of medicine) should, at a minimum, seek input from those who are active in the field. Gillies tells us how much his work benefited from extensive collaborations with virologist Vladimir Vonka; indeed, collaboration and exchange with scientists is a hallmark of the EBM+ approach, of which this book is also a part.

The book is bound to become a must-read for any scholars interested in medical methodology, especially in how notions such as causality, evidence, mechanism, and probability intersect. These intersections have many facets, and Gillies gives us his own story of how they are linked. It is to be hoped that others will contribute to these debates, whether by examining other historical case studies, or exploring other practices in medicine where these issues are at stake.


Dowe, Phil. 2000. Physical Causation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Gillies, Donald. 2011. 'The Russo-Williamson Thesis and the Question of Whether Smoking Causes Heart Disease'. In Causality in the Sciences, edited by Phyllis McKay Illari, Federica Russo, and Jon Williamson, 110-25. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Glennan, Stuart. 1996. 'Mechanisms and the Nature of Causation'. Erkenntnis 44: 49-71.

Glennan, Stuart, and Phyllis McKay Illari, eds. 2017. The Routledge Handbook of Mechanisms and Mechanical Philosophy. Routledge Handbooks in Philosophy. London; New York: Routledge, Taylor & Francis Group.

Machamer, Peter, Lindley Darden, and Carl Craver. 2000. 'Thinking about Mechanisms'. Philosophy of Science 67: 1-25.

Parkkinen, V-P, C. Wallmann, M. Wilde, B. Clarke, P. Illari, M. P. Kelly, C. Norell, F. Russo, B. Shaw, and J. Williamson. 2018. Evaluating Evidence of Mechanisms in Medicine. New York, NY: Springer Berlin Heidelberg.

Russo, Federica, and Jon Williamson. 2007. 'Interpreting Causality in the Health Sciences'. International Studies in Philosophy of Science 21 (2): 157-70.

Salmon, W.C. 1984. Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World. Princeton: Princeton University Press.