Causation and Free Will

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Carolina Sartorio, Causation and Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2016, 188pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746799.

Reviewed by Christopher Evan Franklin, Grove City College


Carolina Sartorio has produced a rich and stimulating set of reflections on the intersection of the metaphysics of free will and causation, with the aim of clarifying the structure and defending the central tenets of an actual-sequence theory of freedom, "where freedom is understood as the metaphysical [rather than epistemic] component of responsibility" (p. 8). While there is overlap between Sartorio's and John Fischer and Mark Ravizza's[1] actual-sequence accounts, Sartorio argues that we can improve on their account by taking more seriously the idea that freedom solely supervenes on the actual sequence, and that we can take the supervenience claim more seriously by attending more carefully to aspects of causation that have played little to no role in the free will literature. She calls the resulting view "the actual-causal-sequence view" (ACS): freedom is grounded exclusively in the actual causal facts.

There seem to be three movements in Sartorio's overall argument. First, beginning with the assumption that Frankfurt cases are successful, she contends that the moral of these cases is that "all that matters to the freedom of an act is how the agent came to perform the act, or the actual history of the act" (p. 18). Second, she argues that an actual-sequence view that is true to the moral of Frankfurt cases must be compatible with the following supervenience claim: "No difference in freedom without a difference in the relevant elements of the causal sequence" (p. 32). Third, she develops an actual-sequence account that is consistent with the above supervenience claim, exploiting (putative) key features of causation that have been widely overlooked in the free will literature.

Chapter 1 lays the groundwork for her subsequent discussion, isolating the main structure and scope of ACS. Chapters 2 and 3 aim to identify key features that causation "arguably has" (p. 45) and "use them to support the grounding claims made by ACS" (p. 46). In particular, Sartorio claims that the causal relation is an (i) intransitive (ii) extrinsic, and (iii) difference-making relation (distinct from, and weaker than, counterfactual dependence) that (iv) can take absences as relata. Chapter 4 offers an analysis of reasons-sensitivity wholly in terms of the actual causes of an action, and Chapter 5 responds to three central incompatibilist arguments: Ultimacy Arguments, Direct Arguments, and Manipulation Arguments.

Despite its brevity, Sartorio's book is chock-full of subtle arguments, fascinating developments of actual-sequence accounts, and unconventional yet impressive analyses of familiar ideas, such as reasons-sensitivity. I cannot even begin to do justice to the full scope, subtly, and richness of her arguments. What I hope to do is give a sense of the heart of her argument and raise some worries along the way.

Chapter 1 takes up the issue of what the structure of an actual-sequence theory should be. Actual-sequence theorists contend that freedom is solely grounded in the actual sequence. But what is the actual sequence? Sartorio contends that the actual sequence of an action consists solely in the causes of that action. An agent's exercising freedom over an action is wholly grounded in the causal history of that action, where its causal history is understood narrowly to include not necessarily the causes of the causes of the action, but rather the causes of the action (as we will see Sartorio denies the transitivity of causation). An alternative formulation of an actual-sequence theory is that freedom supervenes on the causal history of an action plus certain actual, non-causal factors. Perhaps this is how Fischer and Ravizza conceive their theory, as they make reasons-responsiveness and mechanism ownership necessary conditions for freedom, and, yet, under their analysis, it doesn't seem that either feature is always among the causes of an agent's free actions. Sartorio maintains that actual-sequence theorists should embrace ACS over this alternative formulation because it is "simpler, more elegant, and it sustains a more straightforward interpretation of the reasoning behind Frankfurt cases that motivates actual-sequence views" (p. 43).

I take it that Sartorio thinks her view is simpler because it only requires that freedom supervene on one kind of thing, namely causes. Putting aside the issue of elegance and focusing on her final claim, the very idea of actual-sequence theories was born of the conviction that Frankfurt cases are successful -- that agents in these cases exercise the necessary degree of freedom to be morally responsible, even though they are unable to do otherwise. Thus, an adequate actual-sequence theory must make it clear both why the agent is morally responsible and why the counterfactual intervener, the person who stands ready to intervene and force the agent to do what she wants should the agent show any sign of doing otherwise, doesn't affect the agent's freedom. ACS does this in a straightforward way: the counterfactual intervener doesn't affect the causes of the agent's action -- she is a counterfactual intervener after all -- and so her presence is irrelevant to the agent's freedom. The defender of the alternative formulation would have to adopt a more complex explanation, arguing that the counterfactual intervener doesn't affect the agent's freedom because she doesn't affect the causes of the action and doesn't affect the other, non-causal necessary conditions of freedom, whatever those are. Its simple structure and straightforward account of Frankfurt cases recommend ACS, or so Sartorio claims.

The next three chapters develop and defend ACS, with Chapters 2-3 aiming to articulate the underlying metaphysics of ACS and Chapter 4 offering an analysis of reasons-sensitivity consistent with ACS, all the while highlighting putative advantages of ACS over other actual-sequence theories, most notably Fischer and Ravizza's. (I won't comment on Chapter 5 except to say that this chapter seems mostly an afterthought for Sartorio. While it responds to important incompatibilist arguments, it doesn't build on her actual sequence account.)

Chapter 2 highlights three putative features of causation: (i) that absences can be causes, (ii) that causation doesn't entail counterfactual dependence, and (iii) that causation is extrinsic. The bulk of Chapter 2 is devoted to showing how the extrinsicness of causation can enable proponents of ACS to handle a set of difficult cases concerning responsibility for outcomes of actions, while remaining uncompromisingly committed to ACS. She defines this feature of causation as follows:

EXTRINSICNESS: A causal relation between C and E may obtain, in part, owing to factors that are extrinsic to the causal process linking C and E. (p. 71)

To illustrate, she gives a case in which an action helps determine the route to an outcome, but intuitively (to some at least) doesn't cause the outcome. Imagine a case in which a train is headed along route 1. If the train remains on route 1, it will end up at station X. Imagine I switch the train onto route 2, which also leads to station X. In this case, Sartorio claims, "the redirection of the train . . . helps determine the particular way in which the outcome is brought about . . . [but] it arguably doesn't cause the outcome itself: the arrival at the station" (p. 72). Imagine another case in which route 1 doesn't lead to station X but to station Y. In this case, my flipping the switch and directing the train to route 2 does cause the outcome of the train's arriving at station X. Thus, features extrinsic to the process of flipping the switch (e.g. the direction of route 1) partly determine whether flipping the switch causes the train to arrive at station X.

If true, this feature of causation would enable defenders of ACS to handle hitherto difficult cases in which some outcome is inevitable. For example, imagine a rider on a runaway horse in a situation in which no matter how he steers the horse, he will harm pedestrians. This kind of case might seem to be a counterexample to actual-sequence theories since the rider isn't responsible for the outcome and yet, it might seem, his act of steering the horse does cause the outcome. But, with EXTRINSICNESS in hand, Sartorio can argue that, just as in the above train switching case, the rider's act of steering doesn't cause pedestrians to be harmed, but simply determines the route to that outcome. And since the rider's act of steering didn't cause the outcome, he isn't responsible for the outcome. Problem solved.

But sometimes fixing one leak springs another. EXTRINSICNESS seems to imply that agents in Frankfurt cases don't cause their actions and thus aren't, after all, responsible. The counterfactual intervener is in place to ensure that the action will take place no matter what the agent does, and so the agent seems to find himself in a case perfectly analogous to the train and rider cases: he simply determines the route to the outcome without causing the outcome. At first glance I was surprised by Sartorio's claim that causation is an extrinsic relation. I would have thought that Frankfurt cases teach us that the kind of causation relevant to freedom is the productive kind, one that is unaffected by extrinsic features of the process, such as counterfactual interveners.

This worry, which Sartorio is sensitive to, leads us right into Chapter 3, where Sartorio highlights two more features of causation: difference-making and intransitivity. The former is defined as follows:

Difference-Making (Causes): Causes make a difference to their effects in that the effects wouldn't have been caused by the absence of their causes. (p. 94)

Sartorio motivates this putative necessary condition of causation with the following thought experiment. Suppose we have a massive number of perfect soldiers, more than we would ever need to build an army to win a war. The army is perfect but replaceable: perfect because it consists exclusively of perfect soldiers, but replaceable because no one soldier is required for winning the war. Each soldier makes a difference, but not by being irreplaceable. While the outcome (i.e. winning the war) doesn't counterfactually depend on any soldier, "each individual soldier makes a difference at least in [this] sense: his presence makes a contribution [to winning the war] . . . that his absence would not have made" (p. 95).

Does this help solve the problem that EXTRINSICNESS raises for Frankfurt cases? Not obviously. In Sartorio's favored Frankfurt case, Frank's reasons cause his choice to shoot Furt without the counterfactual intervener intervening, and yet the absence of Frank's reasons would have triggered the intervener to intervene and cause Frank's choice. It seems like Frank's choice would have been caused by the absence of Frank's reasons causing the choice, and thus his reasons aren't a difference-maker in the relevant sense.

Enter the final important feature of causation: intransitivity. To claim that causation is intransitive is to deny that it is "always the case that, when A causes B and B causes C, A also causes C" (p. 104). Thus, while it is true that the absence of Frank's reasons would have triggered the intervener, and it is true that the intervener would have caused Frank's choice, this doesn't entail that the absence of those reasons would have caused Frank's choice.

However, intransitivity is insufficient to secure Sartorio's desired result since it only denies that it is always the case that when A causes B and B causes C, A also causes C. While this may not always be the case, it sometimes is. Sartorio claims, however, that "intuitively" transitivity fails in Frank's case since the absence of his reasons creates a "threat" to the occurrence of the choice: "a threat that has to be countered or canceled (by the neuroscientist) in order for the choice to still occur" (p. 104). But this doesn't seem right. Given that the neuroscientist is a fail-safe mechanism already in place, the absence of the reasons doesn't create a threat in this situation. In Frankfurt cases, there is no threat to the outcome: that is precisely why the agent is unable to do otherwise. Moreover, it is the absence of those very reasons that trigger the fail-safe mechanism. Suppose I light a fuse, which ignites a bomb, which blows up a house. I cause the house to blow up. I triggered the bomb and thereby caused the outcome of the bomb's blowing up. Analogously, the absence of Frank's reasons triggers the fail-safe mechanism, and so it would seem that the absence of Frank's reasons cause the outcome of the fail-safe mechanism, namely his choice. It seems that Frank's reasons don't cause his choice in the actual sequence after all, which isn't what the Frankfurt-defender was hoping for.

At this point, one might think the best move for Sartorio is to reject her earlier claim that absences can be causes. But this move isn't available to her since absence causation forms the heart of her analysis of reasons-sensitivity. Let us turn then to Chapter 4.

At first glance, it doesn't seem that a reasons-sensitivity account of freedom is consistent with ACS. Reasons-sensitivity consists partly in the kinds of powers an agent has, and not all these powers, one might think, will be causes of the agent's free actions on every given occasion. Sartorio's ingenious move is appeal to absence causation. Whether Frank is reasons-sensitive in choosing to harm Furt is a function not simply of the presence of reasons that cause his choice, but also the absence of sufficient reasons to refrain from making the choice causing his choice. For example, let us suppose that Frank wouldn't have made this choice if Furt had had five children (call this reason R). Sartorio claims: "Hence it seems that part of what accounts for the fact that Frank made the choice to shoot Furt in the actual scenario is the fact that R was absent" (p. 124). Why should we think the absence of R caused Frank's choice? Sartorio answers: "if it is the case that, had R been present, [Frank] would have reacted to it by failing to make the choice to shoot Furt, it seems clear that R's absence is part of what accounts for the fact that he made the choice in this case" (p. 124), where the context makes clear that by 'accounts for', she means 'causes'.

We thus arrive at Sartorio's analysis of reasons-sensitivity:

CRS (Causal Reasons-sensitivity): An agent is reasons-sensitive in acting in a certain way when the agent acts on the basis of, perhaps in addition to the presence of reasons to act in the relevant way, the absence of sufficient reasons to refrain from acting in that way, for an appropriately wide range of such reasons. (p. 132)

Sartorio's crucial move is to account for reasons-sensitivity in terms of causation by the absence of sufficient reasons to do otherwise, and she motivates her claim that an absence of sufficient reason to do otherwise is a cause of an action by appealing to the fact that the action counterfactually depends on the absence of this reason. How counterfactual dependence is supposed to support the causal claim is unclear. Sartorio tells us in a footnote that while "most causal theorists" deny that counterfactual dependence is necessary for causation, "many" believe it (at least of the right kind) is sufficient for causation. However, Sartorio also tells us that she has argued against this view (in other work[2]), but "for reasons that are orthogonal to the current discussion" (p. 124, n. 20). So does Sartorio think some kinds of counterfactual dependence are sufficient for causation? If so, which kinds? She never says. If not, then how is her argument supposed to work? She never says.

Let me close by returning to Sartorio's claim that her actual-sequence theory is "simpler, more elegant, and it sustains a more straightforward interpretation of the reasoning behind Frankfurt cases that motivates actual-sequence views" than others, such as Fischer and Ravizza's (p. 43). I hope my comments suggest that we should have pause before agreeing with Sartorio. Despite her earlier claim only to be appealing to features of causation that any theory of causation (at least the sense of causation relevant to freedom) must account for, it seems to me that her account requires us to accept a wide range of controversial theses about causation (for example, I am inclined to reject every feature except the claim that causation doesn't entail counterfactual dependence). Moreover, some of these putative features of causation are in deep tension with the success of Frankfurt cases, casting doubt on her claim that her theory offers a "more straightforward" explanation of Frankfurt cases than Fischer and Ravizza's theory.

The clearest payoff of Sartorio's theory is that it is an actual-sequence view in a well-defined sense: freedom is wholly a function of the actual causes. Other actual-sequence accounts appeal to modal features of the agent or mechanism leading to action, and this has always made me wonder why these are considered actual-sequence accounts as opposed to alternative possibilities accounts. It has always seemed to me that these "actual-sequence" accounts simply appeal to different kinds of alternative possibilities or powers than, for example, leeway incompatibilist accounts. Sartorio's account seems best positioned to handle this worry.

Should actual-sequence theorists abandon the more well-trodden accounts developed by Fischer and Ravizza, Ishtiyaque Haji,[3] Michael McKenna,[4] and R. Jay Wallace[5] and embrace ACS? I have my doubts. But the question is well worth asking, and Sartorio's book is well worth consulting in determining the right answer.


Thanks to Justin Coates and Neal Tognazzini for many instructive conversations about these issues, and to Micah Quigley for his helpful comments on an earlier draft.

[1] Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility (Cambridge University Press, 1998).

[2] 'The Prince of Wales Problem for Counterfactual Theories of Causation', in New Waves in Metaphysics, ed. Allan Hazlett (Palgrave Macmillan), pp. 259-276.

[3] Moral Appraisability: Puzzles, Proposals, and Perplexities (Oxford University Press, 1998).

[4] 'Reasons-responsiveness, Agents, and Mechanisms' in Oxford Studies in Agency and Responsibility, vol. 1 ed. David Shoemaker (Oxford University Press, 2013), pp. 151-183.

[5] Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments (Harvard University Press, 1994).