Causation and Its Basis in Fundamental Physics

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Douglas Kutach, Causation and Its Basis in Fundamental Physics, Oxford University Press, 2013, 334pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199936205.

Reviewed by John T. Roberts, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


In this fascinating and carefully constructed book, Douglas Kutach offers new solutions to two central problems in the intersection of philosophy of science and metaphysics. One is about causation, and how to resolve the tension between three competing demands: (i) the prominence of causation in the high-level sciences (like biology and psychology) and common sense; (ii) the apparent absence, pointed out by Russell, of causal notions in fundamental physics (causation apparently requiring both an asymmetry of determination, and determination by more-or-less clearly defined and local factors, neither of which is found in contemporary fundamental physical theories); (iii) the plausible thought that whatever "oomph" or "biff" causation has, it must somehow derive from what goes on in fundamental physics. If we think of causation as gold, then how does it get spun out of fundamental-physical straw? The second problem is that of how physics should be used to inform metaphysics. Kutach offers a novel and plausible answer, which he calls by the deceptively bland name "empirical analysis." The book offers a metaphysics of causation as a solution to the first problem and as an example of how empirical analysis works.

1. Empirical Analysis

Kutach gives his official definition of "empirical analysis" on p. 10:

The empirical analysis of X is the engineering of a conceptual framework optimized in the service of the scientific explanation of whatever empirical phenomena motivate our possession of a concept of X, especially insofar as they are characterized in terms of experiments.

In the pages that immediately follow, Kutach provides a discussion that more helpfully conveys what he is getting at, and how it differs from some more familiar sorts of philosophical project. You start with the X -- the topic of your analysis, in this case causation -- and a great big set of relatively uncontroversial truths about X (platitudes). Your task is to make sense of what X could be, in the light of all these uncontroversial truths about it and of what else we know about the world. In what Kutach calls "orthodox analysis" (which seems to include both old-fashioned a priori conceptual analysis as well as the kind of Ramsey-sentence-inspired approach championed by Lewis, in which one uses a priori means to identify the role played by the referent of a concept, and then uses empirical means to identify the filler of that role), one sets out to find necessary and sufficient conditions for the concept that will make as many of the platitudes as possible come out true. Since most of the philosophically interesting concepts have relatively uncontroversial truths about them that pull in different directions, it always turns out to be impossible to get all of them right; one must sacrifice some of the putative uncontroversial truths in order to get an analysis that elegantly accounts for the rest of them. But, Kutach complains, orthodox analysis has no principled way of weighing these putative uncontroversial truths against one another and deciding what to sacrifice for the sake of what (p. 9); hence, the tendency of metaphysical disputes to reach stalemates. Kutach aims to do better.

A Kutachian empirical analysis aims at facilitating the scientific explanation of why we have the concept X in the first place. The first order of business is to identify those empirical phenomena that make it helpful for creatures like us to have a concept of X. If possible, these empirical phenomena are to be regimented as experiments that have been found to have characteristic results. The next task is to identify those elements of fundamental reality that can be used to explain why these experiments typically come out the way they do. These aspects of fundamental reality, together with the derivative realities they give rise to, that appear in those explanations, are then what makes it useful for us to have a concept of X -- and even if it does not follow that they will make good candidates for what we ordinarily refer to when we speak of X, it does follow that it makes sense to think of them as the X-like features of reality which ultimately explain why we get on so well speaking of X.

Once we have done this, Kutach believes, we are finished doing the metaphysics of X. This will leave a lot of work to be done in explaining why we say and think the particular things we do about X -- about why we readily assent to all the putative truths in the great big set of X-platitudes. But the remaining work calls for a psychological explanation -- one that will presumably be facilitated by the metaphysics we have given, but that is not itself properly part of metaphysics (which Kutach defines as "the general study of reality" (p. 43)). The resulting package-deal of a metaphysics together with a psychological explanation might render many X-platitudes false. It will have done its job so long as it explains, in terms of fundamental reality, why it is useful for us to have the concept of X in the first place, and then explains why we tend to say the things about X that we do.

2. Metaphysics of Causation

In the case where X = causation, Kutach thinks the primary phenomenon that makes it useful for us to have the concept is that of an effective strategy (p. 14): not every robust statistical correlation is usefully exploitable in order to bring about one of its terms by bringing about the other, but some of them are, and as practical agents we need a conceptual repertoire that is good for marking the difference between the ones that are and the ones that aren't, and this is what our repertoire of causal concepts is for.

What an effective strategy does, in Kutach's preferred terminology, is to promote an outcome, and when Kutach regiments the phenomenon of the existence of effective strategies into an experiment, he arrives at what he calls the promotion experiment. Another is the fact that we find we can promote outcomes in the future but not the past. Kutach regiments this fact as the asymmetry experiment. It goes like this (leaving out some details; see pp. 226-228): subjects of the experiment are randomly divided into two teams, team DO and team DONT, each with a zillion members; members of team DO are incentivized to bring it about that some event E occurs, whereas members of team DONT are incentivized to bring it about that some event E does not occur (there is a different E for each subject); each subject learns which team she is on at a time START. The event E occurs earlier than START. The usual outcome of the experiment is that E occurs no more frequently for subjects on team DO than it does for subjects on team DONT.

The task for a metaphysics of causation, then, is to identify the features of fundamental reality that are responsible for these experimental facts, which is in turn responsible for the fact that it is so useful to us to think of our world as causally structured. Carrying out this task does not require us to hew closely to the surface grammar of ordinary causal discourse:

It does not matter ultimately whether 'causation' is a term appropriately applied to the fundamental causation-like relations or whether there are 'causes' in physics. The important task is to uncover which fundamental structures serve as an adequate foundation for the scientific explanation of empirical phenomena that motivate causal terminology. (p. 54)

In Kutach's metaphysics, there are two fundamental "causation-like" relations. They are both relations that hold among fundamental events (where a fundamental event is, roughly, a region of space-time together with the values of one or more fundamental physical quantities throughout that region). The first is termining: one fundamental event termines a second (roughly speaking) just in case the first nomologically determines that the second happens, or that it doesn't happen, or that it has a certain physical probability of happening. The second is contributing: one fundamental event c contributes to a second one e just in case it is a part of some larger event c' that termines e, such that if c were removed from c', then what remained of c' would fail to termine e. (Thus, the notion of contributing is a descendent of Mackie's notion of an INUS condition.)

Fundamental events and the terminance and contribution relations among them belong to fundamental reality, but the causation-like phenomena we find in higher-level phenomena belong to what Kutach calls "derivative reality." This consists of all those phenomena that are such that what is true of them is completely determined by fundamental reality together with one or more choices of values for parameters that are "fundamentally arbitrary" (p. 27). (For example, in a Neo-Newtonian world, relative velocities belong to fundamental reality, and absolute velocities belong to derivative reality, since what is true or false of them is settled by the relative velocities together with the arbitrary selection of a reference frame.)

Kutach defines a coarse-grained event as any set of possible fundamental events; a contextualized event is a coarse-grained event together with a probability distribution defined over its members; a contrastive event is an ordered pair of contextualized events, called the protrast and the contrast. The key causal notion at the level of derivative reality is that of promotion, which comes in degrees. A contrastive event C promotes a coarse-grained event E to the extent that the probability assigned by C's protrast to E exceeds that assigned by C's contrast to E.

The probability functions involved in these contrastive events don't have to be physical chances, or long-run frequencies; they don't have to correspond to anything physical at all; so long as they satisfy the probability axioms, they can be completely made-up. This fact is key to the way Kutach's notion of degree-of-promotion works. Let me illustrate it with an example (not Kutach's).

Consider the event of Wile E. Coyote's running off a cliff and that of his grotesque disfigurement seconds later. Let E be the event of Wile E.'s grotesque disfigurement; this is a coarse-grained event, which, recall, is the same thing as a set of fundamental events. The idea is that there are numerous possible fundamental events involving the spatiotemporal location of Wile E. that would "realize" a bodily state in which he is grotesquely disfigured; all of these fundamental events are in the set E, and no others are. (Since "grotesquely disfigured" is vague, it will be a vague matter which set E we are talking about here, but this is harmless.) Now let C1 be the contextualized event of Wile E.'s running off of a cliff. Actually, there is no unique such event: recall that a contextualized event is a coarse-grained event (i.e., a set of fundamental events) with a probability distribution defined over it. This coarse-grained event includes all of the fundamental events that "realize" Wile E. running over a cliff, with some "reasonable" probability distribution defined over it.

For example, very unusual ways in which the running-over-the-cliff might happen -- ways that involve macroscopic violations of the second law of thermodynamics, or that involve Wile E.'s brain going into a state that realizes the mental state of resolving never to chase the Road Runner again -- should be assigned relatively low probabilities (or probability densities), while more typical ways in which this sort of thing happens (e.g., with Wile E. already plotting his revenge against the Road Runner) receiving higher values. Of course, this leaves the probability distribution in C1 wildly underspecified, but kindly hold off on this objection for just a moment.

C2 needs to be a contextually reasonable contrast to C1 -- for example, perhaps it is the event of Wile E. skidding to a halt just before reaching the edge of a cliff. C2 will include all the possible fundamental events that would realize that macro-event, together with a "reasonable" probability distribution over them. Now assume determinism for simplicity's sake; there is a subset of the fundamental states in C1 that are destined to evolve within a few seconds into one of the fundamental states that is a member of E; in any intuitive sense of "most," this must include most of the members of C1, but no doubt there are a few fundamental states in C1 in which a fortuitious gust of wind, or a luckily placed trampoline, saves the day for Mr. Coyote. The probability that C1 assigns to E is the total probability that C1's probability distribution assigns to all of the fundamental states that do evolve into states in E. The probability that C2 assigns to E is defined likewise.

Given the underdetermination of the probability functions essential to C1 and C2, the difference between these probabilities is underdetermined. But it seems perfectly obvious that if we were to define those probability functions in any way that would strike us as reasonable, then the probability C1 assigned to E would be much higher than the one that C2 assigns to it. In other words, Wile E.'s running over a cliff (rather than skidding to a halt right before reaching its edge) promotes his being grotesquely disfigured a few seconds later to a very high degree.

Higher-level general causal claims, according to Kutach, are made true and useful by the existence of degree-of-promotion facts like this one. These belong to the level of derivative reality, because they are made true by a few fundamentally arbitrary choices of parameters -- namely, a choice of a contrastive event (which includes two probability distributions that need not correspond to physical chances) to play the role of cause, and a choice of a coarse-grained event to play the role of effect -- together with the facts about terminance relations among fundamental events, which are part of fundamental reality.

By contrast, Kutach believes that facts about singular causal relations among ordinary events -- the kinds of singular causal relations we are most often concerned with in science and everyday life -- are not part of derivative reality. Our thought and discourse about them is governed by heuristics and rules of thumb, which sometimes come into conflict (e.g., in cases involving overdetermination, or causation by omission). What needs explaining here is the psychology of our propensity to make judgments in the way we do; there is no reason to expect a theory that satisfies strict standards of rigor to be forthcoming. So there is no reason to desire or hope for a consistent and unified theory that shows how the truth-values of all singular-causal claims are settled by fundamental reality together with arbitrary choices of parameter values. Moreover, Kutach argues that information about what causes what in this sense -- a sense he labels "culpable causation" -- adds no empirical content whatsoever to the information about terminance and promotion relations; it is important to us, though, as a heuristic device (p. 269; pp. 274-275). In short, the theory of these causal relations -- while an important part of the philosophy of causation -- does not belong to the metaphysics of causation (pp. 266-267). Good news for metaphysicians of causation: they do not need to solve the problem of why Her Majesty's failure to water my plants did not cause their death.

3. Explaining the Asymmetry Experiment

Kutach identifies his explanation of the asymmetry experiment as one of the two most important contributions of the book, with the other being the methodology of empirical analysis (p. 309). The explanation (found on pp. 232-239) is ingenious, and for the sake of space I won't summarize it here, but will only point out a couple of important features of it. First, on Kutach's view, we influence the past all the time (since our actions stand in terminance relations to earlier events); the reason why there appears to be a temporal asymmetry of causation is that we are systematically incapable of exploiting our influence on the past in order to promote desired macro-level outcomes. His explanation of the asymmetry experiment consists of an argument that establishes this incapacity of ours.

Second, one crucial premise of the argument is a principle he calls future typicality, which says that when we look to the earlier-to-later evolution of the universe (or at least, the part of the universe we inhabit), "bizarre coincidences" do not occur on a large scale. The argument works, essentially, by showing that if there were agents capable of deliberately influencing the past, then they would be capable of creating large-scale bizarre coincidences, violating future-typicality.

This makes me doubt whether the argument can really explain our inability to influence the past, as revealed by the asymmetry experiment. If there were agents who were able to reliably influence the past, then of course there would be bizarre coincidences; that's what influencing the past is for. For instance, if I could send signals to my one-day-younger self, there would be a bizarre coincidence between the stocks I buy on a given morning and the stocks whose prices go way up later that day; even more obviously, if I could send such messages, there would be bizarre coincidences between my receiving such messages on one day and the absences of random interferences that prevent me from sending them on the next day. Indeed, it follows almost immediately from the presence of agents with the ability to influence their own local past that there will be such bizarre coincidences. So the fact that there are no such bizarre coincidences in our part of the universe cannot explain the absence of any such agents -- for the absence of such agents is evidently one of the things that forestalls there being such coincidences.

This would not be so if there were some explanation of the absence of the bizarre coincidences that is plausibly explanatorily prior to the absence of the agents. Perhaps there is -- as Kutach says (p. 185), if there is an explanation of the entropy asymmetry, it will almost certainly explain the asymmetry of bizarre coincidences. But until we are supplied with an actual explanation of the entropy asymmetry, this does nothing to help us explain why there are no agents with the ability to influence the past.

4. Causation and Explanation

Can Kutach's account do justice to the role that singular causation seems to play in explanation? He thinks it can: "The more restrictive conception of singular cause that I have labeled 'culpable cause' is useful for epistemological purposes like causal explanation" (p. 283). Is causal explanation an "epistemological purpose"? There is an epistemic conception of explanation according to which explanation aims to render events less surprising (see Salmon (1984)), and Kutach explicitly endorses this conception as at least a partial account of explanation (p. 277). But today almost all philosophers reject the idea that satisfying this epistemic conception can be sufficient for explanation, motivated in part by examples like Bromberger's famous flagpole-shadow case. Indeed, one of the main reasons for the surge in interest in causation among philosophers of science in the past few decades has been the hope that causation will provide an extra, non-epistemic ingredient needed to complete an account of scientific explanation (Salmon (2006)). So many philosophers are likely to think that in his empirical analysis of causation, Kutach has left out one of the main reasons why it makes sense for us to have a battery of causal concepts -- namely, our interest in explaining what happens in the world -- and that when he appeals to the epistemic conception of explanation to account for the role of causes in explanation, he has got the wrong end of the stick.

This might be the leading end of an important difficulty for Kutach's approach. It is noteworthy in this connection that on p. 289, Kutach acknowledges that every event is a terminant of itself; the only reason he offers for thinking that this does not imply that every event causally explains itself is that it would be practically useless to cite an event as a cause of itself since this would "provide no new information." If causation is supposed to provide a crucial non-epistemic element in explanation, and events are not supposed to be able to explain themselves, then we have a real problem here, which Kutach evades only by reverting to an epistemic conception of causal explanation.

5. Conclusion

Despite the objections raised in the two preceding sections, I think this is a terrific metaphysics of science book. In particular, the methodology of what Kutach calls "empirical analysis" is a genuinely new and important contribution to the debate about how science should be used to guide metaphysics. Though he doesn't tout this, it should be particularly attractive to philosophers drawn to pragmatism. Moreover, I have seen no attempt to solve the problem of resolving the tension between the three demands mentioned at the outset of this review worked out in as much detail and with as much care as Kutach's. His book should be read by all philosophers with an interest in either the metaphysics of causation or the question of how science should inform metaphysics.

Salmon, Wesley C. (1984), Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World, Princeton University Press.

--- (2006), Four Decades of Scientific Explanation, University of Pittsburgh Press.