Causation and Modern Philosophy

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Keith Allen and Tom Stoneham (eds.), Causation and Modern Philosophy, Routledge, 2011, 273pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415883559.

Reviewed by Walter Ott, Virginia Tech


Keith Allen and Tom Stoneham's anthology is a very welcome addition to the growing literature on this central topic in the modern period. Unlike its closest predecessor -- Steven Nadler's 1993 volume[1] -- the work included here goes far beyond the rationalists of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. While Descartes in particular as well as Leibniz and Spinoza are well-represented, along with, of course, Hume and Kant, we also find essays on Galileo, Thomas Brown, and Mary Shepherd. Although one wishes Malebranche, Locke and Berkeley popped up a bit more often, it would be churlish to complain of their absence in a volume that is already so ambitious.

Tad Schmaltz's "Primary and Secondary Causes in Descartes' Physics" defends the interpretation articulated in his recent Descartes on Causation (Oxford, 2008). Schmaltz argues that Descartes is best read as attributing genuine causal powers to bodies and relegating God's role to merely conserving these bodies. In the Principles, Descartes distinguishes between the primary cause, namely, God, and secondary causes. Unlike those of his scholastic predecessors, however, Descartes's secondary causes are not bodies but laws. Schmaltz claims that "from our post-Humean perspective such rules or laws would seem to be mere empirical generalizations, hardly the sort of entity that could serve as a cause" (p. 38). Schmaltz then proceeds to read away Descartes's claim: it is not really the laws that cause anything, but instead the forces of individual bodies. As Schmaltz and others have recognized, it is not obvious that Descartes's ontology of body has room for force. How could force be squashed into the narrow ontology of extension and its modes? Drawing on the work of Alan Gabbey, Schmaltz claims that "force is simply to be identified with the attribute of existence or duration" (p. 41).

While this is an intriguing hypothesis, I wonder if there is not some sleight of hand at work. The thought seems to be that, simply in virtue of existing, a body has an inherent tendency to continue to exist in the same state. There are two related problems here. First, Descartes is clear in the Principles that things tend to persist in the same state only because God continuously creates them so. Second, the Schmaltz/Gabbey view seems to me to ignore the implications of the famous Third Meditation passage (CSM II 33/AT VII 49) in which Descartes's Meditator claims that God must preserve her at each moment of her existence. Surely the implication of this passage is that created beings do not (of themselves) tend to continue to exist at all, let alone in the same state.

In their "Causation and the Cartesian Reduction of Motion," William Eaton and Robert Higgerson argue that, pace Schmaltz, Descartes is an occasionalist with regard to body-body causation. It is worth distinguishing the question whether Descartes self-consciously holds occasionalism from whether it follows from what the authors call 'solid Cartesian principles.' They claim that the answer to the second question is 'yes,' regardless of how we answer the first. Eaton and Higgerson make their case by defending the cinematic view of motion, according to which there is nothing more to a body's moving from place a to place b than God's creating that body first at a and then at b. On this view, there is no room for one body to act on another, since only God's will is relevant to motion.[2]

The other half of Eaton and Higgerson's case concerns the transfer model of causation. On this view, if a causes b then there must be "a genuine transfer of power, a conveyance of an efficacious quality from the former to the latter" (p. 55). Part of their evidence for the claim that Descartes endorses this model comes from the Principles, where he says that, in a collision, a quantity of motion is "imparted" to the body struck (CSM I 242/AT VIIIA 65). (Curiously enough, the authors seem to realize that if Descartes really means this, then in fact occasionalism could not be his considered view). Whether Descartes holds the transfer model or not, however, there is solid evidence for the claim that he denies that qualities or modes can migrate from one body to another. Although the authors claim that it is not easy to find a straightforward denial of the possibility of modal transfer, it in fact follows from Descartes's rejection of real qualities (see, e.g., Letter to Elizabeth, May 21, 1643, CSMK 219/AT III 667).

Eric Schliesser's bewilderingly rich "Spinoza's Conatus as an Essence-Preserving, Attribute-Neutral Immanent Cause" casts Spinoza as trying to fill a gap in Descartes's philosophy. Descartes's laws are laws only for material substances; whether there is any analogue of inertia or the conservation of motion in the realm of the mind is, according to Schliesser, left unclear. Spinoza provides a unified account of physical and mental phenomena under the heading of 'conatus' or striving. Schliesser rejects any reading of conatus in dynamic terms; the role of conatus is not to preserve the existence of an entity over time, but rather to preserve its essence. This is a puzzling claim, since, as Schliesser emphasizes, Spinoza identifies conatus and essence (E III P 7). But Schliesser thinks the dynamic reading is undermined by Spinoza's claim (E III P 8) that striving involves an indefinite time. Schliesser infers from this that conatus does not have magnitude and that it therefore cannot be read as existence-preserving (p. 79).

For my part, I cannot see how these inferences are supposed to work. Whether and in what sense conatus can be measured, or can be said to take place over time, seem to me to be orthogonal to the questions of existence and essence. What is perhaps of more interest is Schliesser's insistence that conatus be read in Baconian terms as a "nature-engendering nature" (p. 80). On Schliesser's view, conatus is a substitute for scholastic natural kinds. At the same time, Schliesser insists that "the striving and reality of finite things is in some important sense illusory" (p. 81), since, on his reading, Spinoza takes finite things themselves to be artifacts of the exercise of the imagination. How all of this fits together, and whether it would help to make the notoriously fallacious argument of Ethics III P 6 cogent, are not made clear in Schliesser's essay, though it would probably take a monograph to do so.

In "Are Mind-Body Relations Natural and Intelligible?" Pauline Phemister examines the exchange between Leibniz and Damaris Masham. Masham argues that interactionism is preferable to pre-established harmony since only the former can explain "the intricate organization of bodies' innermost parts" (p. 87). Leibniz, of course, rejects interactionism because of his bedrock commitment to the in principle intelligibility of the world, a commitment that interactionism, with its mysterious mind-body causal links, violates.

Masham's challenge in effect turns this intelligibility criterion against Leibniz himself. Phemister argues that to meet it Leibniz tries to establish that the mind-body relation is "intelligible because it is necessary or essential and it is so precisely because it arises necessarily or essentially from the natural, but non-interactionist, means God chose to effect the relation" (p. 99). One issue is just what it means to call a relation intelligible or natural. Is the necessity of a relation enough to make it intelligible? Perhaps, if that relation arises "naturally" in the ordinary sense of the term: that is, if a and b stand in R because a brings about or alters b in some way such that R obtains. But as Phemister points out, this is not Leibniz's view; the only thing that ties mental and bodily states together seems to be God's choice. Now, this choice is not arbitrary, since God seemingly must choose the best possible world; but it is hard to see how that entitles Leibniz to claim that there is a natural and intelligible connection between, say, color sensations and brain states. This is where Phemister makes her most intriguing contribution. She marshals Leibniz's theory of isomorphic representation to show that in fact the bodily states represented by sensations -- even pain sensations -- must be as they are, if the representation relation is to hold. This helps to answer Masham's original challenge and brings out an intriguing theory of representation.

With Timothy Stanton's "Hobbes's Redefinition of the Commonwealth," the volume makes its only foray into political philosophy. Stanton provides a useful discussion of Hobbes's adaptation of Aristotle's four causes and uses this, inter alia, to argue against those interpretations that take Hobbes to be providing a temporal account of the origin of a commonwealth. Hobbes is not in the business of giving a putatively historical account of how human beings come together to form a commonwealth. Instead, his goal is to provide a definition and thus an account of the origin of the name 'commonwealth,' thereby bringing "men to see the civil association of which they are a part in those terms and thence to play their part in keeping it in existence" (p. 118). Though Stanton's paper is, as its author and the editors seem to acknowledge, rather the odd man out in the collection, it is a useful reminder of the broad reach of theorizing about causation in the modern period.

In "Hume, Causal Realism, and Free Will," Peter Millican reiterates his challenge to the New Humeans and examines three recent attempts -- by Helen Beebee, P.J.E. Kail, and John Wright -- to meet it. Following Kail, Millican's 'New Humeans' include not just those who, like Beebee, take Hume to be a realist about 'Causation,' where this involves strongly mind-independent 'thick' causal connections, but also those who, like Kail himself, take Hume to be at least agnostic about Causation. What all New Humean readings have in common, then, is the assertion that for Hume, Causation is at least coherently conceivable. Millican's challenge points to Hume's 'doctrine of necessity' in the context of free will. In these passages, Hume is particularly clear that Causation is not in fact conceivable. Millican convincingly argues that none of his opponents' attempts to read away such passages is plausible. I am not alone in thinking the New Hume debate has run its course; as Millican says at the end of his essay, "it is time to call it a day" (p. 158).

Constantine Sandis ("Pouring New Wine into Old Skin") engages the New Hume debate by drawing attention to Hume's views on meaning.[3] On Sandis's view, both the Old and New Humeans neglect Hume's theory of meaning,[4] which, Sandis thinks, entails that there is no intelligible content to any position in the 'metaphysical dispute' about causation and necessity. Sandis agrees with the New Humeans that Hume the skeptic cannot dogmatically deny the existence of Causation. But this agreement arises only because Sandis's 'deflationary' reading prevents his Hume from taking any position on the metaphysics of Causation. If we cannot think about Causation at all, we cannot a fortiori be agnostic about its existence. It remains obscure to me why Sandis thinks this point should allow us to move beyond "thinking of Hume as a skeptical realist, antirealist, quasi-realist, or standard realist about either C/causation or N/necessity" (p. 181). If all talk of Causation is meaningless, then isn't Hume straightforwardly the Hume of the Old variety? Sandis seems to think that claims about meaning cannot have consequences for metaphysics. But one doesn't need to read Hume as a logical positivist to think otherwise.

Boris Hennig answers his titular question -- "Is Causation a Relation?" -- with a resounding 'no.' Hennig begins by claiming that, if there are causal relations, "they should be adequately represented by pairs of items" (p. 189). This is an odd (though perhaps merely stipulative) criterion; obviously there are polyadic relations, and the most plausible early modern views (such as those of Locke and Boyle) go out of their way to point out that causation is not dyadic.

Hume, of course, answers Hennig's question in the positive. Hennig reconstructs Hume's argument thus: cause and effect must be distinct things because (a) causation is a philosophical relation, and (b) no philosophical relation can hold between a thing and itself. From here, it is easy to deploy the separability and conceivability principles to show that cause and effect are conceptually independent (p. 198). But this reconstruction strikes me as perverse. As Hennig himself seems to see, the argument for the relationality of causation has nothing to do with (a) and (b) (see Treatise I.iii.2 and Hennig p. 191). Oddly, Hennig himself discusses that argument and lodges some convincing objections.

On Hennig's view, any adequate description of cause and effect as such reveals them as "parts of one process" (p. 194). In a perhaps dubious move, Hennig then argues from the description to the metaphysics: cause and effect are not distinct items linked by a relation but are instead identical. Hennig points out that Hume is obviously wrong to say that "water has suffocated every human creature" (Enquiry IV); the cause of suffocation and drowning must involve a host of other factors. When we underdescribe the cause as one thing, it becomes easy to separate it, in thought, from its putative effect. When we describe the event fully enough to make it a plausible candidate for being a cause, we inevitably, for Hennig, end up including a description of the effect. So cause and effect are (in some sense) the same thing.

There are many objections one might raise to Hennig's intriguing proposal. Here, I will only note what I think of as an unclarity in the position being argued for. Is the claim that cause and effect are (i) numerically identical, (ii) identical only in the sense that person-stages might be stages of one and the same person, or (iii) discrete 'parts' of a process, standing in a polyadic relation? The third option is what Hennig most often seems to suggest. But then, of course, causation is after all a relation; at most Hennig would have established that it is not a dyadic relation between two objects. And this seems fairly clear on anyone's view.

Martha Bolton's contribution also takes up a response to Hume, that of Mary Shepherd. Like Hennig, Shepherd seeks to block Hume's easy path to severing cause from effect. This is not because she collapses the two, as Hennig does; rather, she thinks we perceive cause and effect as simultaneous. It is only by treating the two as temporally successive that Hume is able to deny the necessary connection between the two (p. 244). It is not clear to me how all causes and effects could be simultaneous, since this makes it impossible for any change to begin. It is equally unclear how simultaneity could help to answer Hume's challenges; Kant, for example, treats most causes and effects as simultaneous and yet never suggests that this helps to make for an answer to Hume.

Shepherd invokes further metaphysical principles to argue that (1) anything (whether substance or not) that begins to be has a cause, and (2) necessarily, similar causes have similar effects. There is not space here to delve into these principles; indeed, for the reader unfamiliar with Shepherd, Bolton's paper itself seems to struggle to present the scaffolding of the view. Proposition (2) seems to depend on a vaguely Lockean picture of essences, which, together with (1), entitles Shepherd to say that if (2) were false, a quality would come into existence uncaused. What is more, Shepherd connects these principles with the problem of induction: given (1) and (2), the course of nature cannot change. I cannot see how this is supposed to help solve Hume's epistemic (as opposed to metaphysical) problem. Suppose that the white stuff falling from the sky in winter were to behave exactly as snow does except that it burned human flesh. In such a case, Shepherd "contends that it is not snow" (p. 251). This preserves our inductions at the price of vacuity. If one builds into the concept snow all its characteristic powers as we now understand them, one can of course insulate oneself from any possible falsification just by declaring that any putative counterexample is, by definition, not snow.

The final essay I shall discuss considers an alleged tension in Kant's view. In the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Kant presents the 'first maxim of mechanism': "all generation of material things and their forms must be judged as possible in accordance with merely mechanical laws."[5] Angela Breitenbach's "Kant on Causal Knowledge" argues that this first maxim is merely regulative. Once this step is taken, it becomes hard to see how Kant could also insist on the necessity of mechanical explanations in science (p. 209). Breitenbach's solution, so far as I can grasp it, is to claim that, while the concept of the mechanism of nature is indeed constitutive, the maxim is not and is merely regulative (p. 213). The concept says something about the causal relations in which everything must stand, while the maxim instructs us to think of nature as if it were structured by particular laws. If Breitenbach is right, then the problem Kant poses for mechanism lies in our need to see nature as structured not just by causal interactions but by interactions that fall under laws. Breitenbach regards this as a virtue of her account, but one might object that the whole issue in the third Critique turns on the need to invoke teleology in explaining living organisms. What is more, Breitenbach's discussion seems oddly insulated from Kant's own solution to the antinomy created by the first two maxims of mechanism (see the "Dialectic of the Teleological Power of Judgment"). It is also curiously insulated from some of the relevant secondary literature.[6]

In this short survey, I have not found room to discuss two excellent contributions, David Wootton's paper on Galileo and Stathis Psillos's work on Thomas Brown. But I hope to have given the reader a sense of the scope and interest of Allen and Stoneham's anthology.[7]

[1] Causation in Early Modern Philosophy, ed. Steven Nadler (Pennsylvania State University Press, 1993).

[2] Although the authors call this a 'reductive' view of motion, it is not obvious how the reduction is supposed to work. To say that motion can be accounted for in terms of 'location plus duration via divine conservation' does not make clear how motion could be a mode of a body, at least if a mode is supposed to be a monadic property.

[3] Mysteriously -- and a bit annoyingly -- Sandis's section headings are all slightly altered titles of Bob Dylan songs.

[4] Sandis does little to extract from Hume's own texts a theory -- or even a view -- of meaning. Instead, he relies on comments from Cudworth and Johnson. But this procedure seems tenuous at best and is in any case unnecessary, since Hume gives us quite enough to work with. See my 'Hume on Meaning,' Hume Studies 32, 3 (2006).

[5] It is worth noting that any similarity between 'mechanism' in this context and in that of the rest of the time period is merely orthographical. Kant's maxim of mechanism does not deny the possibility of action at a distance or the reality of forces.

[6] As far as I can tell, Michael Friedman (Kant and the Exact Sciences, Harvard, 1992) was the first to suggest reading the reflective judgments of the third Critique in light of the regulative Ideas of the first. But this suggestion has already been subjected to critical scrutiny that Breitenbach seemingly ignores. See, e.g., Eckhart Förster, Kant's Final Synthesis (Harvard, 2000), esp. 7-9. Also relevant is Kenneth Westphal, Kant's Transcendental Proof of Realism (Cambridge, 2003).

[7] I am indebted to Bryan Hall for helpful discussion of these issues.