Causation, Explanation, and the Metaphysics of Aspect

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Bradford Skow, Causation, Explanation, and the Metaphysics of Aspect, Oxford University Press, 2018, 182pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198826965.

Reviewed by Alastair Wilson, University of Birmingham


Bradford Skow has a hammer -- the distinction between levels of reasons why -- and he has discovered a new box of nails.[1] In this short but sweet 182-page carpentry project, Skow applies the framework of his recent Reasons Why (2016) to some puzzles about explanatory background conditions, dispositions, structural explanation, and agent causation. The underlying theme is that we can understand all these notions in terms of second-order reasons why -- that is to say, reasons why A is a reason why B -- just so long as we pay close attention to the grammatical form of explanatory claims. In each case, the core of his account is straightforward enough, and sounds natural to English speakers. A background condition for a causal explanation is a reason why the cause causes the effect; a disposition is always a disposition for its bearer to act; a structural explanation uses structural features of a situation to explain why certain things had certain effects; and all causation happens ultimately in virtue of the activity of agents. Skow's overall picture is ingenious and coherent. It is explained with admirable clarity and concision. There remains room for doubt about the book's underlying method.

What is the titular metaphysics of aspect? Skow borrows from work in grammar and linguistics to focus on the distinction between stative verbs (as in "A was wobbly") and non-stative verbs (as in "B wobbled"), and he works this grammatical distinction up into a deep metaphysical distinction between states (something's being a certain way) and events (something's doing something). Causings are actings, and so only agents (in a broad sense which includes inanimate objects) can be basic causes: according to Skow, "the most fundamental causal locution is "X caused Y to Z by Ving," where terms for things (that are not events) go in for "X" and "Y" (p.18). States cannot be causes in their own right, but only second-order reasons why some agent (or, derivatively, some event) is the cause of some effect. The resulting picture of the world has it made up of things doing things, and thereby causing other things to do other things. While this certainly sounds commonsensical, much of it constitutes a departure from orthodoxy in the metaphysics of causal explanation. According to orthodoxy, states (or at least: obtainings of states in spacetime regions) can be causes, and there need be no agent involved in a cause. Perhaps surprisingly, Skow's departures from orthodoxy are motivated not by logical or scientific considerations but primarily through intuition and grammatical analysis. The philosophical method of the book accordingly has a retro feel: there is a distinct flavour of ordinary language philosophy, albeit ordinary language philosophy updated with reference to the progress that has been made in linguistics over the intervening 60 years.[2]

The starting points of Skow's arguments are typically causal-explanatory claims that we are invited to find intuitively plausible, as deployers of causal reasoning and as competent speakers of English (Skow does not examine cross-linguistic data). This procedure of "checking your intuitions" (p.27) is presented as giving us evidence that bears on philosophical theories about causation. For example, each of the following claims is presented as intuitive and then treated as a premise in reasoning at some stage of the book:

  • ""the property of being striking a match". . . is nonsense, as is "the property of striking a match"" (p.37)
  • ""the act of being red". . . names nothing" (p.38)
  • "there is no such property as "the property of freezing"" (p.41)
  • ""one thing he did was be tired". . . does not make sense" (p.96)
  • "if dispositions didn't have to be dispositions to act . . . we should be able to form predicates in English for some of the non-act dispositions . . . we cannot." (p.98)
  • "When others exercise their ability to see Saturn, they do not cause Saturn to do anything; certainly they do not cause it to "be seen."" (p.104)
  • "That executing these intentions would result in your standing in the kitchen . . . isn't the sort of thing that can have causes." (p.127)
  • "Things like people and windows, not to mention quarks and leptons, are metaphysically more basic than events." (p.139)
  • "["the light caused the car to be at rest by being red"] . . . is necessarily false" (p.143)
  • "there is no such act as "the act of not watering the flowers."" (p.157)
  • ""the property of running". . . cannot name a property, or anything else, since it is ill-formed" (p.158)

Taken together, these definite verdicts convey a decidedly prescriptive account of language use: deviation from correct grammatical form results in genuine nonsense, not mere infelicity.

Of course, we all need some premises, and (as Dorr 2010 memorably remarks) we don't get them from a premise factory. Still, there is little explicit scrutiny in Skow's book of what it might mean for something to not make sense, or more broadly of why our judgments of what is grammatical in English should have power of veto over our theories of the causal-explanatory structure of the world. Skow's most explicit statements of his methodology suggest that it takes the form of an inference to the best explanation: his theory of the causal-explanatory structure of the world should be accepted because it best explains the patterns of grammaticality and ungrammaticality in English sentences. But there are other ways to explain the relevant features of English grammar, and many of these explanations assign a significant role to historical contingency. It seems to me that Skow needs to do more in the way of comparing his account with alternative explanations of the aspectual features of English grammar if his overall inference to the best explanation is to carry force.

My line of objection here presupposes that the metaphysical project Skow is pursuing is broadly a realist one, rather than a form of descriptive metaphysics which is content to map the contours of our concepts but which countenances no further questions about what the world is really like. He never disavows realism, though, perhaps tellingly, he does talk of "the most fundamental causal locution" (p.19) rather than of the fundamental causal facts. Taken as descriptive metaphysics, and restricting to English speakers, Skow's claims about our causal concepts are for the most part quite compelling. But few metaphysicians today are willing to limit themselves to extracting metaphysical commitments from natural language; there is no a priori reason to think that English is adequate to the task of formulating the best overall theory of the world, and some reason (in particular, its historically contingent elements) to think that it probably isn't adequate. It would be quite surprising if, after only a few tens of thousands of years' experience with complex language use, Homo sapiens had already developed a grammar for which well-formedness of causal-explanatory sentences exactly aligns with the metaphysically possible types of causal-explanatory situation. English has no special metaphysical authority; it only became the primary language of contemporary analytic philosophy thanks to European economic dominance during a few crucial centuries of human history. We ought to be open to formulating our metaphysical theories in formal languages with semantics and syntax which deviate from the semantics and syntax of English, where that leads to improved power and unity in total theory. Skow may agree with the above critique of descriptive metaphysics, in which case I hope he will also agree that more needs to be done to assess the plausibility of his proposed view than to cite judgments about grammaticality in its support.

Setting aside methodological disagreements, this book is a quick, easy and rewarding read which draws interesting new links between topics that might have seemed to many readers to be unconnected. Along the way Skow provides an accessible introduction to the grammatical and linguistic literature on verb aspect, highlights underappreciated work by Thomson and Wolterstorff from the 1970s, brings some much needed clarity to discussions of what structural explanation might be, thoroughly assesses the case for the existence of extrinsic dispositions (Skow thinks they exist, but not in the form envisaged by most of the recent literature), and uses his theory of agent causation to deflate the puzzles of causation by absence. Anyone with a serious interest in metaphysics will find these discussions interesting and illuminating.

In its stated aim to open up new space for philosophical discussion of the phenomenon of grammatical aspect and its potential relevance to metaphysics, the book clearly succeeds. It also succeeds in delineating a bold and interesting pattern of conceptual connections between familiar causal notions. In particular, Skow's account of the distinction between causes and background conditions as robustly metaphysical, rather than as merely pragmatic, seems likely to become a standard reference point in the literature. No doubt many will find his systematic metaphysics of causation, as constituted by the activity of active entities, a very attractive one. Is the system attractive because (as Skow would maintain) it vindicates a large body of known data, or is it attractive because it vindicates the parochial metaphysical presuppositions that happen to have been encoded in English grammar? I suggest that you read the book and decide for yourself.


Dorr, C. (2010). Review of "Every Thing Must Go: Metaphysics Naturalized", by James Ladyman and Don Ross, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2010.06.16.

Skow, B. (2016). Reasons Why. Oxford University Press.

[1] Skow adopts this metaphor to describe his own project (p.14).

[2] Skow maintains that J.L. Austin’s language-use-centric philosophical method was largely on target (p.21), although he thinks that Austin should have focused more on grammar and less on vocabulary.