Causes, Laws, and Free Will: Why Determinism Doesn't Matter

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Kadri Vihvelin, Causes, Laws, and Free Will: Why Determinism Doesn't Matter, Oxford University Press, 2013, 284pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199795185.

Reviewed by Christopher Evan Franklin, Marymount University


Kadri Vihvelin offers a detailed and rigorous inquiry into the classic free will debate, defending four main theses: (1) that free will is possible, (2) that Frankfurt-style cases (FSCs) fail to undermine the traditional debate about the compatibility of free will and determinism, (3) that there are no good arguments for incompatibilism, and (4) that we possess free will in virtue of both possessing a bundle of dispositions and being situated in environments in which there are no obstacles to the manifestation of these dispositions. She dubs the position that emerges from her discussion "commonsense metaphysical compatibilism" (32). Her position on free will is 'commonsense' because it agrees with commonsense that we have free will and are morally responsible (32-3). Her position is 'metaphysical compatibilism' because it contends that free will and moral responsibility are compatible with determinism because the ability to do otherwise is compatible with determinism (18). Her metaphysical compatibilism is to be contrasted with "moral compatibilism", which defends the compatibility of moral responsibility and determinism by denying that the ability to do otherwise is necessary for moral responsibility.

Chapter 1 offers a lucid presentation of the problem of free will and determinism, defining the central terms and controversies. Chapter 2 lays out Vihvelin's methodology, making clear what a successful defense of compatibilism entails, and argues that there are no good arguments for concluding that free will is impossible (focusing particularly on fatalistic arguments). Chapter 3 details the content of our commonsense beliefs about free will with the aim of showing that these beliefs do not commit us to Agent Causation. Chapter 4 argues that FSCs are not genuine counterexamples to the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP), which states that an agent is morally responsible only if he could have done otherwise. Chapter 5 considers and rejects five arguments for incompatibilism. Chapter 6 argues that we possess free will in virtue of possessing a bundle of dispositions and being situated in an obstacle-free environment, and offers a tentative analysis of dispositions. Chapter 7 defends "Fixed Past Compatibilism", which is, roughly, the conjunction of common sense compatibilism and David Lewis's theory of counterfactuals.

Vihvelin's book is unapologetically metaphysical, each feature of her position is treated in detail, and her main theses will command wide interest. There is, however, a surprising lack of thoroughness in her defense of her four main theses, especially (2) and (3). Her most important contributions are her objections to Frankfurt's famous strategy for arguing that the ability to do otherwise is not necessary for moral responsibility (chapter 4) and her development of a distinctive analysis of free will (chapter 6), both of which in turn can be traced to her theory of abilities and dispositions. Vihvelin argues that the English term 'ability' has a variety of senses. First there is 'ability' in the sense of 'know-how' or 'skill.' This sense does not figure prominently in her discussion. Her focus rather is on the following two senses: 'narrow ability' and 'wide ability.' When an agent S has the narrow ability to X, "S has what it takes to do X: she's got the necessary skills and the psychological and physical capacity to use those skills" (11). When a skilled bike rider breaks both his legs in a terrible fall, he retains his bike riding skills but loses his narrow ability to ride a bike since he loses the necessary physical capacities for riding bikes. When S has the wide ability to X "S has what it takes to X . . . and, moreover, she's got the means and opportunity and nothing external stands in her way" (11). An expert bike rider who is in excellent psychological and physical condition may be unable to ride a bike due to the fact that there are no bikes within hundreds of miles. While she retains the skill and narrow ability to ride a bike, she lacks the wide ability to ride a bike. Vihvelin contends that narrow abilities nomologically supervene on an agent's intrinsic properties, while wide abilities supervene also on extrinsic properties (13). An agent loses a narrow ability to X only by undergoing a change of intrinsic properties, whereas an agent loses a wide ability to X either by losing the narrow ability to X or if there is an obstacle to her exercising her narrow ability to X, where a feature F is an obstacle to S's doing X only if had S tried to X and F is present, then S would have failed to X (110).

Vihvelin spends a large portion of chapter 6 explaining and defending the claim that to have a narrow "ability to act is to have a disposition or bundle of dispositions" (171). In particular she offers a novel and rich analysis of dispositions that attempts to combine insights from rival analyses offered by David Lewis and David Manley and Ryan Wasserman.[1] There is much of interest here, but since she contends that none of her defenses of her main theses turn on her particular analysis, I will (however reluctantly) focus my attention on how she thinks the distinction between narrow and wide ability is key to defending compatibilism and undermining attacks on PAP.

Vihvelin contends that a central issue over which compatibilists divide is the relevance of metaphysics for theorizing about moral responsibility. Most compatibilists attempt to defend the compatibility of moral responsibility and determinism by arguing that careful reflection on the nature of moral responsibility shows that PAP is false, and thus determinism is not a threat. She calls such compatibilists 'moral compatibilists' (18). The most widely discussed version of moral compatibilism appeals to FSCs to show that PAP is false, and Vihvelin's response in chapter 4 is novel and suggestive. But there is an important lacuna in Vihvelin's defense of PAP in particular and her defense of the relevance of metaphysics more generally. Vihvelin notes that there are other strategies for rejecting PAP, most prominently articulated by P.F. Strawson and further developed by R. Jay Wallace, where one develops a theory of moral responsibility that accounts for our entire range of excusing and exempting practices without recourse to the ability to do otherwise (91-2).[2] Vihvelin has nothing to say in response to these moral compatibilists, and so even if her response to FSCs is entirely successful, her defense of PAP is incomplete.

Vihvelin divides FSCs into two kinds: Bodyguard cases and Preemptor cases (97-8). A Bodyguard intervener is triggered by the beginning of any choice or action contrary to the intervener's plan (97). A Preemptor intervener is triggered by an earlier, non-actional event that is a reliable indicator that the agent will, absent intervention, choose and act contrary to the intervener's plan (98). Vihvelin maintains that Bodyguard cases, no matter how ingeniously described, cannot, in principle, be a counterexample to PAP because the trigger for intervention is the agent's doing, or beginning to do, otherwise. The intervener will intervene only if the agent begins to do otherwise, and thus the agent retains some ability to do otherwise. This, she contends, is enough to show that Bodyguard cases cannot be genuine counterexamples since "To refute PAP one would have to tell a story in which an agent is responsible for what he did even though he could not have done anything other than he actually did" (95). This putative constraint on a successful counterexample to PAP is controversial. Some have argued that it is enough if FSCs show that the remaining abilities to do otherwise are irrelevant to explaining the agent's moral responsibility.[3]

Her response to Preemptor cases is more fascinating. She contends that agents in these cases retain both the narrow and wide ability to do otherwise. Given that the Preemptor is a counterfactual intervener, the agent's intrinsic properties are unaffected. But this entails that the agent's narrow abilities are unaffected. Surely though the intervener affects the agent's wide abilities. Vihvelin thinks not. Recall that if an agent has a narrow ability to X and there are no obstacles to the agent's exercising this ability, then she has the wide ability to X. We have already seen that the agent retains the narrow ability to do otherwise in Preemptor cases, and so these cases eliminate the wide ability to do otherwise only if they present an obstacle to the agent's exercising her narrow ability to do otherwise. Vihvelin maintains that it is clear that the counterfactual intervener presents no obstacles. Given her definition of an obstacle, the Preemptor functions as an obstacle to the agent's exercising her narrow ability to do otherwise only if the Preemptor would frustrate any attempt of the agent to do otherwise. But the Preemptor does not function this way. The Preemptor makes it impossible for the agent to even begin to try to do otherwise. Thus the only possible worlds in which the agent tries to do otherwise are worlds in which the Preemptor is absent, and thus there is no possible world where the agent tries to do otherwise and yet the Preemptor frustrates this attempt. Preemptors are not obstacles. I'll return to Vihvelin's notion of obstacle below.

Compatibilists must, then, face up to the distinctively metaphysical task of showing that the ability to do otherwise is compatible with determinism. Vihvelin maintains, rightly to my mind, that a defense of metaphysical compatibilism only requires that we be able to describe a case in which an agent seems to exercise free will in a deterministic world and to show that there are no incompatibilist arguments that reveal a hidden contradiction in this description (30). Chapter 5 aims to show that compatibilists can discharge this argumentative burden. The focus of this chapter is rather surprising. First, rather than spending the bulk of her time responding to the consequence and manipulation arguments, the most well-known and well-defended incompatibilist arguments, she gives equal treatment to three other incompatibilist arguments, two of which I have never seen in print (at least not in the last century). Second, her treatment of the manipulation argument is incomplete. She only discusses Derk Pereboom's four-case manipulation argument, saying nothing about Alfred Mele's equally important zygote argument.[4] Moreover, her treatment of Pereboom's argument inexplicably overlooks the essential idea, which is that there appears to be no difference between cases in which agents are severely manipulated and cases of agents in ordinary deterministic settings. Compatibilists must either show where there is a relevant difference or why it is acceptable to believe that agents are responsible even when thus manipulated. Vihvelin does not clearly defend either view and in the end it is just not clear what her response is.

Finally, her treatment of the consequence argument is frustrating. She focuses her discussion on Peter van Inwagen's influential third version of the consequence argument that turns on an inference rule known as Beta.[5] Thomas McKay and David Johnson developed a counterexample to this key inference principle nearly twenty years ago and it has been universally recognized that the counterexample is devastating to this version of the consequence argument.[6] Why, then, would Vihvelin discuss this and not the numerous other versions developed with the aim of avoiding the problems with Beta? Vihvelin's answer is exhausted by her assertion that all these other versions "lack the strong intuitive pull of the original version" (162). Vihvelin does buttress her response by appealing to David Lewis's famous charge that the consequence argument turns on an equivocation between a strong and weak sense of ability. But again much ink has been spilled by incompatibilists over the last thirty years arguing that Lewis's charge does not stick. Vihvelin ignores this literature. The consequence of these combined deficiencies is that Vihvelin's defense of compatibilism fails to respond to the strongest version of incompatibilism and thus her defense of thesis (3) is significantly incomplete.

We do, however, find the beginnings of a systemic reply to incompatibilists that builds on her distinction between narrow and wide ability. Vihvelin's arguments would have been greatly strengthened by developing and defending this analysis in more detail. But there is enough to see how the response would go. If determinism is incompatible with free will it must either be incompatible with the narrow or wide ability to do otherwise. Given that narrow abilities are just bundles of dispositions, it is clear that determinism is compatible with the narrow ability to do otherwise. No one thinks an unstruck match lacks the disposition to light simply because determinism is true. Thus, if determinism is a threat to free will it must be a threat to our wide ability to do otherwise. Remember wide abilities depend on narrow abilities and the absence of obstacles. Given that determinism leaves our narrow abilities unaffected, determinism is incompatible with the wide ability to do otherwise only if it presents an obstacle to exercising our narrow abilities to do otherwise. Vihvelin's definition of obstacles should make it clear that determinism is not an obstacle. The truth of determinism does not entail that if I had tried to do otherwise I would have failed. Thus determinism is not an obstacle.

Vihvelin's discussion of abilities, dispositions, and counterfactuals is one of the best to date. It is the highlight of the book and something that most of us will learn a lot from. But there is a weak link: her definition of obstacles. Her argument requires us to assume that while a feature that prevents my attempting to do otherwise from being successful is an obstacle, a feature that prevents me even from attempting to do otherwise is not an obstacle. There is no defense of this assumption, and it is far from obvious. It will surely be the main target of incompatibilist objections. Oddly Vihvelin thinks incompatibilists are most likely to resist her claim that narrow abilities are just bundles of dispositions (195). Vihvelin seems to misunderstand or overlook the main worries of, and motivation behind, incompatibilism, and her defense of compatibilism suffers for it.

This deficiency also affects her response to FSCs. According to Vihvelin, because the Preemptor makes it impossible for the agent to even try to exercise his narrow ability to do otherwise, the Preemptor is not an obstacle. But isn't this an obstacle par excellence? If a feature counts as an obstacle because it frustrates my attempt to X, won't a feature that makes it impossible for me to even try to do X also count as an obstacle? Metaphysical compatibilists are committed to defending a negative answer to these questions, and this is one of their most important tasks. One will, however, search in vain for Vihvelin's defense of this central claim.

My review has focused on the heart of Vihvelin's arguments, but she makes other important contributions. Her discussions of the precise content of commonsense beliefs concerning our freedom (chapter 3) and the argumentative dialectic in the free will debate (chapter 2) are insightful and strike me as right on the money. Compatibilists, especially more metaphysically minded compatibilists, will do well to pay careful attention to Vihvelin's work. It provides a plausible framework for defending classical compatibilism, even if, as I have hoped to show, more work is needed to shore up considerable gaps in her defense this position.[7]

[1] David Lewis, 'Finkish Dispositions', Philosophical Quarterly 47 (1997): 143-158; David Manley and Ryan Wasserman, 'On Linking Dispositions and Conditionals', Mind 117 (2008): 59-84.

[2] P.F. Strawson, 'Freedom and Resentment', Proceedings of the British Academy 48 (1962): 187-211; R. Jay Wallace, Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1994).

[3] Derk Pereboom, Living without Free Will (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001); Felipe Leon and Neal A. Tognazzini, 'Why Frankfurt-examples Don't Need to Succeed to Succeed',Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 80 (2010): 551-565.

[4] Derk Pereboom, Living without Free Will; Alfred R. Mele, Free Will and Luck (New York: Oxford University Press, 2006).

[5] Peter van Inwagen, An Essay on Free Will (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1983). Vihvelin states the rule as follows: "Beta: Np, N(⊃ q), therefore Nq", where "'Np' abbreviates 'p and no one has, or ever had, any choice about whether p' (157).

[6] Thomas McKay and David Johnson, 'A Reconsideration of an Argument Against Compatibilism', Philosophical Topics 24 (1996): 113-122.

[7] I am grateful to John Fischer for his helpful suggestions.