Challenges for Humanitarian Intervention: Ethical Demand and Political Reality

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C. A. J. Coady, Ned Dobos, and Sagar Sanyal (eds.), Challenges for Humanitarian Intervention: Ethical Demand and Political Reality, Oxford University Press, 2018, 224pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812852.

Reviewed by Jeff Holzgrefe, DPIR, Oxford


International law criminalizes acts of genocide, crimes against humanity, ethnic cleansing and war crimes. The same international law also bans the use of military force except in self-defence or with the approval of the UN Security Council. From this it follows that states require the approval of the UN Security Council if they wish to employ military force to stop other states from massacring their own citizens within their own borders. When that approval is withheld, states willing to stop such atrocities must choose between helplessly watching the carnage continue and violating the bright-line international legal ban on the use of force against other states.

Most legal positivists make the consequentialist argument that, as tragic as massive violations of human rights are, international law must be obeyed if the international system is not to collapse into total anarchy (Henkin, 1979). Political realists for their part object to any intervention undertaken to protect the rights of foreigners. As Samuel Huntington notoriously claimed, "it is morally unjustifiable and politically indefensible that members of the [United States] military should be killed to prevent Somalis from killing one another" (Huntington, 1992). Many supporters of human rights, however, argue that the use of armed force to end acts that "shock the conscience of mankind" should become the third exception to the UN Charter's ban on the use of transboundary force in international relations. Proponents of this view have laboured mightily both to specify the exact circumstances in which such interventions are morally justified and to incorporate those specifications into international law.

The apogee of this project was the 2001 Report by the International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty (ICISS) entitled The Responsibility to Protect (R2P). In it, the ICISS argued that military interventions must satisfy the standard just war criteria of just cause, right intention, last resort, proportional means, reasonable chance of success and right authority. Its interpretation of the last criterion was the most controversial part of the report in so far as it argued that, if the Security Council refuses to authorize the use of military force to avert or end atrocities, then "it is unrealistic to expect that concerned states will rule out other means and forms of action to meet the gravity and urgency of these situations." (p. 55). In other words, if the Security Council fails to avert or end large-scale violations of human rights, it falls to members of the international community to discharge that responsibility for them. Indeed, this part of the Report was so controversial that it was completely omitted from the Responsibility to Protect Populations from Genocide, War Crimes, Ethnic Cleansing and Crimes against Humanity section of the UN's 2005 World Outcome Document.

Most research on humanitarian intervention since 2001 produced little more than glosses on the Responsibility to Protect report. C.A.J. Coady, Ned Dobos and Sagar Sanyal's anthology is the latest addition to this burgeoning literature. This collection of ten original essays, however, is unusual in that most of the contributors view the Responsibility to Protect through critical, if not jaundiced, eyes. Such scepticism is to be expected from legal positivists and realists, but contributors to this volume do not appear to subscribe to either moral tradition. To the contrary, all appear to be cosmopolitans frustrated that humanitarian intervention has failed to realize its moral promise. As such, their attacks on humanitarian intervention might best be understood as barrages of "friendly fire" rather than enemy attacks.

The two most carefully argued and insightful contributions are Janna Thompson's "Women and Humanitarian Intervention" and Chrisantha Hermanson's "Scrutinizing Intentions." Working within the just war tradition, Thompson asks inter alia why the sexual enslavement, physical abuse, rape and oppression of women by groups such as ISIS and the Taliban currently falls below the just cause threshold for military intervention. From a human rights perspective, it is almost self-evident that such harms are sufficiently grave to be considered legitimate grounds for humanitarian rescue. Yet some commentators (Walzer, Cohen) are reluctant to accept this view, arguing that military interventions to liberate women in such societies would violate those societies' right to self-determination. Thompson rightly replies that, absent the ability to learn, communicate, organize and publicly protest, it is factually incorrect and morally perverse to claim that female members of such societies participate in their societies' self-determination in any meaningful way. Thompson of course does not suggest that a humanitarian intervention to liberate such women is likely to succeed at acceptable cost. She merely argues, first, that the current just cause threshold is too high and, second, that the reasonable chance of success standard is a far more important criterion when it comes to deciding whether to engage in a humanitarian intervention.

Hermanson's "Scrutinizing Intentions" analyses the common criticism that the Responsibility to Protect opens the door to military interventions motivated by self-interest rather than humanitarian ends. For consequentialists like Nicholas J. Wheeler (2000) and Jean-Baptiste Jeangène Vilmer (2007), this reproach is beside the point as an intervener's motives are irrelevant to the justness of an intervention -- at the end of the day, it is only the final outcome that matters. Indeed, as Ryan Goodman (2006) persuasively demonstrates, a completely disinterested state is far less likely to engage in a humanitarian rescue than one with mixed motives. So, by demanding that an intervener possess a purely humanitarian intent, just war theorists would paradoxically reduce the chances a humanitarian rescue would ever take place.

Given that most interveners' motives will be mixed, Hermanson goes on to analyse exactly how mixed they can be without fatally compromising an intervention's justness. First, she examines the case when an intervener had "secondary, sometimes even unjust, motives for intervening but did not attempt to attain these secondary motives through actions outside of those needed to achieve the just cause." (p. 160). For instance, an intervener may wish to install a friendly government in the target state for self-interested reasons. If installing that government is a means to achieving the humanitarian end, the intervener's actions do not constitute an unjust use of force. Second, Hermanson examines the case where an intervener has a secondary intention whose realization involved actions unrelated to achieving the humanitarian end. For example, an intervener may wish to install a friendly government in the target state for self-interested reasons, although such an act is not needed to achieve the humanitarian end. Hermanson argues that this action would still be justifiable or non-abusive so long as: "(a) the intervener's secondary aims were not unjust, (b) the secondary aims were not attained through the use of force, and (c) the interveners gained the consent of the target population regarding their secondary aims." (p. 160). Finally, she argues that "when a society is recovering from mass atrocities it is unjust for interveners to place conditions on their aid, except in those cases where the conditions are necessary to prevent some other moral wrong." (p. 160). Having created a degree of conceptual clarity hitherto unknown in the threat of abuse/right intention debate, Hermanson's chapter would have benefitted from applying her right intention standards to actual humanitarian interventions. But, such a project, while highly desirable, may perhaps be best left for another time.

Most of the remaining chapters critique humanitarian interventions on the grounds that they produce more harm than good. This is largely an empirical claim and an eccentric body of evidence is adduced to support it. Stephen Zunes' "Complicating the Moral Case of Responsibility to Protect: Kosovo and Libya", for example, argues that foreign interventions "exacerbate violence in the short term and then can only reduce violence in the longer term if the intervener is impartial or neutral, which it rarely is." (p. 15). Exhibit A for this claim is the fact that more Kosovar Albanians were killed and driven from their homes after NATO's bombing campaign began than before. But while it is certainly true that more Kosovar Albanians were murdered and forcibly deported after hostilities started, this only proves that the rate at which atrocities were committed accelerated once the war began, not that the Serb's exhaustively documented goal of ridding Kosovo of its ethnic Albanian population -- "a village a day keeps NATO away" in the words of the Yugoslav foreign minister -- was somehow new or unexpected.[1] To argue otherwise is to ignore the mass murder, mass rapes and ethnic cleansing conducted by Serbian military and paramilitary forces in Bosnia and Croatia over the preceding eight years.

Another contributor who is sceptical about humanitarian interventions is Marco Meyer. His central contention is that the Responsibility to Protect has

the potential to make states leery of each other, and thereby to weaken the international order. Many powerful states are deeply suspicious of each other's foreign policy as it is, especially when it comes to military intervention. Keeping the peace . . . requires sufficiently simple rules that they can be easily monitored by each state. The worry is that R2P introduces a level of epistemic complexity that threatens peace. (p. 101)

While it is of course logically possible that states may be unable to discover an intervening state's intentions with 100% certainty, most 21st century intelligence and diplomatic services should be able to readily ascertain an intervenor's motives. Indeed, Meyer concedes as much when he writes that the "force of [my] objection [to humanitarian intervention] depends on empirical claims which I cannot settle here . . . Investigating these empirical assumptions requires the skills of a political scientist rather than those of a philosopher." (p. 101, 119). In short, he offers little more than an implausible hypothesis for others to test.

Contributors, including Aidan Hehir, Robert W. Murray and Tom Keating, are also sceptical that humanitarian concerns have produced humanitarian interventions. But if this were true, why did the United States intervene in Somalia in 1992 -- a country in which it had no economic and security interests -- if not for humanitarian reasons? And why did a multi-state NATO-led coalition intervene in Libya in 2011 except to avoid a second Srebrenica in Benghazi? After all, Gaddafi had eliminated his country's weapons of mass destruction, including a decades-old nuclear weapons program in 2003, and was an important partner in suppressing Islamic terrorism in North Africa and providing oil to Western Europe. And why is the United States still in Afghanistan -- a country that had one third the GDP of Boise, Idaho in 2001 -- after it had long ceased to be a security threat? What could possibly explain why, by 2014, total US appropriations for Afghanistan's reconstruction, after adjustment for inflation, already exceeded the total of US aid committed to the Marshall Plan, if not humanitarian motives?

After realizing that claims that universal jurisdiction and the International Criminal Court would radically increase compliance with international human rights law were grossly oversold, it is perhaps natural that some might fear they have been gulled again -- this time by the promoters of the Responsibility to Protect. Yet while such an attitude is understandable, a closer look at the empirical evidence reveals that humanitarian intervention's record is nowhere near as poor as some of the contributors assert. According to Matthew Krain, to give only one example, the likelihood that atrocities will escalate over the previous year falls from 2 in 3 absent a humanitarian intervention to 1 in 3 with a multilateral humanitarian intervention.[2] Many other empirical studies reach similar conclusions. This is not to suggest that philosophers should immediately retrain as political scientists. It is merely to recommend that, if your argument makes an empirical claim about the effectiveness of humanitarian interventions, you should familiarize yourself with the empirical literature on the subject.


Jean L. Cohen, "Rethinking Human Rights, Democracy and Sovereignty in the Age of Globalization," Political Theory, Vol. 36, 2008, p. 587.

Gareth J. Evans, and Mohamed Sahnoun, The Responsibility to Protect: Report of the International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty, Ottawa, International Development Research Centre, 2001.

Ryan Goodman, "Humanitarian Intervention and Pretexts for War," American Journal of International Law, Vol. 100, 2006, pp. 107-141.

Louis Henkin, How Nations Behave: Law and Foreign Policy, 1979 p. 145.

Samuel P. Huntington, "New Contingencies, Old Roles", Joint Forces Quarterly, 1992, p. 338.

Matthew Krain, "International Intervention and the Severity of Genocides and Politicides," International Studies Quarterly, Vol. 49, 2005, pp. 363-387.

Prosecutor v. Milutinović et al. (Trial Judgment), IT-05-87-T, International Criminal Tribunal for the former Yugoslavia (ICTY), 26 November 2009.

M. Patrick Regan and Aysegul Aydin, Diplomacy and other Forms of Intervention: Combined Strategies and the Duration of Civil War, Binghamton University, 2004.

UN General Assembly, 2005 World Summit Outcome: Resolution Adopted by the General Assembly, 24 October 2005, A/RES/60/1.

Jean-Baptiste Jeangène Vilmer, "Humanitarian Intervention and Disinterestedness," Peace Review: A Journal of Social Justice, Vol. 19, No. 2, 2007, pp. 207-216.

Michael Walzer, "The Moral Standing of States: A Response to Four Critics," Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 9, 1980, pp. 225-226.

Nicholas J. Wheeler, Saving Strangers: Humanitarian Intervention in International Society, Oxford University Press, 2000.

[1] Prosecutor v. Milutinović et al. (Trial Judgment), IT-05-87-T, International Criminal Tribunal for the former Yugoslavia (ICTY), 26 November 2009.

[2] Matthew Krain, "International Intervention and the Severity of Genocides and Politicides," International Studies Quarterly, Vol. 49, 2005, pp. 363-387. See also: M. Patrick Regan and Aysegul Aydin, Diplomacy and other Forms of Intervention: Combined Strategies and the Duration of Civil War, Binghamton University, 2004.