Challenges to Moral and Religious Belief: Disagreement and Evolution

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Michael Bergmann and Patrick Kain (eds.), Challenges to Moral and Religious Belief: Disagreement and Evolution, Oxford University Press, 2014, 298pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669776.

Reviewed by Helen De Cruz, University of Oxford/VU University Amsterdam


Moral and religious beliefs are frequently scrutinized in the philosophical literature as well as in the wider society. Recent philosophical discussions have focused on two kinds of sources of skepticism for these beliefs, which Michael Bergmann and Patrick Kain categorize broadly as 'disagreement' and 'evolution'. Should we trust moral or religious beliefs, given that there is significant disagreement about them? Should we trust moral or religious beliefs, given their evolutionary history?

This edited collection contains 14 essays that treat various combinations of the topics ethics, religion, disagreement, and evolution to answer these questions. The volume has an interdisciplinary scope, although the majority of contributors are philosophers. The non-philosophers who contributed are two anthropologists (Richard Sosis and Jordan Kiper), a psychologist (Sarah Brosnan) and a religious studies scholar (Charles Mathewes).

The book is rich and heterogeneous. Some papers provide useful reviews of the literature, for instance, Brosnan reviews evolutionary research on altruism in animals and its relevance for human moral behavior. Others engage with ongoing philosophical discussions, for instance, William FitzPatrick questions the assumptions underlying Sharon Street's Darwinian dilemma, arguing that debunkers make overreaching claims about the etiology of moral beliefs that are not supported by the actual science. Yet other papers are works in philosophical theology. For instance, Mathewes defends the concept of Hell against recent challenges, using a traditional Augustinian approach of Hell as the absence of good. The volume consists of three parts that explore the relationships between ethics, religion, disagreement and evolution in distinct ways. For each part, I will briefly discuss two papers to give the reader a sense of its scope.

Part I focuses on disagreement in the moral and religious domains, with essays by Ralph Wedgwood, Water Sinnott-Armstrong, Robert Audi, and John Pittard. Most of the epistemological literature on disagreement (e.g., The Epistemology of Disagreement, Christensen and Lackey, OUP, 2013) takes disagreement as a general epistemological phenomenon without specific consideration of the topics on which disagreement centers. The idea is that we can attain a generally appropriate response to disagreement, regardless of its contents. By contrast, Part I provides a more focused discussion of disagreement about religion or moral norms.

Sinnott-Armstrong's paper on moral disagreement with psychopaths focuses on an idealized disagreement between a neurotypical person and a psychopath. Suppose that a psychopath genuinely does not agree with a neurotypical person that it is wrong to steal, rape and murder. Does this disagreement cast doubt on a wide range of moral judgments? It is commendable that Sinnott-Armstrong goes to great lengths to explain how psychopathy is measured, and how different studies use different criteria to distinguish between psychopaths and members of the normal population. It is very hard to measure to what extent psychopaths make moral judgments, or whether they simply answer what they have learned people around them judge as morally right or wrong. It is even harder to assess whether psychopaths report what they really feel, or rather, what they think the experimenter wants to hear. Suppose it turns out a rational psychopath really does not believe murdering, raping and stealing are morally wrong. Sinnott-Armstrong argues that in this case, one cannot cogently challenge the rationality of the psychopath without assuming what he denies. We nevertheless can still assume some form of epistemic justification, namely when we restrict our contrast class to those people who are not psychopaths or other moral nihilists.

Pittard focuses on conciliationism and its role in religious disagreement. According to moderate conciliationism, being confronted with a disagreement constitutes a skeptical threat and should lead one to revise one's belief only insofar as we think the other person is equally well-informed, and equally likely to have reasoned correctly from the available evidence. If we assume this moderate conciliationist position, what follows when a religious believer is confronted with a disputant who brings forward a very different set of religious beliefs? Pittard argues that conciliationism gives us little reason to think that religious skepticism will follow. Drawing on religious examples from Christianity, he proposes that systems of religious beliefs contain their own controversial epistemic standards on how one should evaluate religious claims. Most religious theories of epistemic credentials are self-favoring to some extent. For instance, Paul's letter to the Corinthians advocates that the possession of wisdom in the standard sense of the term does not help one to acquire true beliefs about God. The qualifications that do matter in many religious systems are, as a matter of fact, not the types of qualifications that matter in other intellectual disputes, such as scientific disagreements. They include qualities like humility and a willingness to trust God in the absence of evidence or proof. Pittard concludes that this affords religious believers some protection from disagreement-motivated skepticism. Whether it is rational for religious believers to adhere to non-standard ways to evaluate epistemic credentials is a different matter.

Part II delves into disagreement about moral beliefs, looking at religious and non-religious sources. It features papers by John Hare, Mathewes, Timothy P. Jackson, Mark C. Murphy and Street. As a recent global Pew forum survey revealed, a sizeable percentage of the world's population believes that religion is a prerequisite for leading a moral life. By contrast, others have grounded their moral beliefs in non-religious sources such as intuition and reflective reasoning. There is thus a deep disagreement about what the sources of moral beliefs might be. This part of the book fits very well in the analytic theology tradition, the emerging subfield of analytic philosophy that is concerned with theological topics. Part II features discussion on divine command theory (Hare), the problem of Hell (Mathewes), sanctity and the imago Dei (Jackson), Anselmian perfect being theology and goodness (Murphy) and the problem of evil (Street).

The papers by Murphy and Street provide a good illustration of how metaphysical assumptions about theism or naturalism can give rise to deep disagreements about the problem of evil. Murphy starts with an Anselmian concept of God as a perfect being. If God is morally perfect in an Anselmian sense, we have no reason to expect that he would create a state of affairs that is good for us humans. To Murphy, that would be just as strange as arguing that God's perfection should be amoebae-centered. In other words, he challenges the view that God must exhibit familiar welfare-oriented moral goodness.

By contrast, Street takes a naturalistic point of view, starting from the observation of a particular instance of horrendous evil (a seven-year-old girl tragically dies in a drunk driving accident), a tactic that has been successfully employed in the philosophical arguments from evil literature. In a case like this, the atheist takes moral appearances at face value and argues that this is a bad state of affairs. By contrast, a theist who is committed to a traditional concept of God as all-good is forced to accept the deeply skeptical conclusion that our commonsense beliefs about moral goodness and badness are unreliable, otherwise God would not have permitted a seven-year-old to die in this way. Moral common sense provides no guide at all as to what God will or won't allow to happen. The price for theism, therefore, is moral skepticism.

Part III looks closer at evolutionary debunking of moral and religious beliefs. It is perhaps the most interdisciplinary part of this collection, featuring papers by Brosnan, who is a psychologist, Sosis and Kiper, two anthropologists, next to contributions by philosophers Dustin Locke, FitzPatrick and Joshua Thurow.

Sosis and Kiper's contribution argues that religion is more than belief. As has been long recognized in the anthropological literature they review, practices such as prayer and ritual are a crucial element of religion. In their view, religions should be studied as complex adaptive phenomena, where beliefs are important, but not the only element worthy of consideration. Cross-cultural evidence suggests that doubt appears to be an inherent quality of religious beliefs worldwide. Unlike philosophers, who use reason and argument to assess potentially problematic religious beliefs, most ordinary religious believers do not sustain their beliefs by analytic reasoning (if anything, according to some empirical studies, this seems to decrease religious beliefs). Rather, they nourish their beliefs through rituals, myths, symbols and prayer. The stability of religious practices is compatible with doubt and unstable beliefs. Since debunking arguments against religion are usually aimed at the doxastic aspects of religion (e.g., challenging the rationality of belief in God), Sosis and Kiper contend that evolutionary explanations do not challenge religion.

Thurow ("Does the Scientific Study of Religion Cast Doubt on Religious Beliefs?") surveys several ways in which the cognitive science of religion casts doubt on theism. He also discusses three natural theological arguments in the light of the cognitive science of religion: C.S. Lewis' argument from desire (which is a peculiar choice, given that this argument has not received much attention in scholarly philosophy of religion), and the cosmological and design arguments. Thurow argues that the cognitive science of religion casts doubt on Lewis's argument from desire, but that the teleological and cosmological arguments remain unaffected.1 Essentially, the argument is that cognitive scientists of religion can explain the teleological and causal intuitions that underlie the cosmological and design arguments. For example, the work of Deborah Kelemen shows that young children have a tendency to overattribute purposiveness to features in the world around them, and this tendency is also present in adults under cognitive load (e.g., adults are more likely to endorse wrong teleological explanations such as "the Sun radiates heat to nurture life on Earth" than other wrong explanations when put under time pressure). But these tendencies say little about whether the intuitions that underlie natural theology are off-track. After all, philosophers and natural theologians are not under high cognitive load (hopefully) when they develop their arguments, and education decreases over-attribution of teleology, making it plausible that we become better at attributing design properly.

On the whole, this book provides a readable and stimulating set of papers. Challenges to religious and moral beliefs from disagreement and evolution have become prominent in the philosophical literature, and an edited collection on these topics is timely. I sometimes got the impression the scope of the volume was a bit broad -- after all, religion and morality, though related, are distinct topics in the literature, and disagreement and evolution present their unique challenges, in spite of some overlap. However, the collection did a good job of making connections between these topics (especially part II, which considers the religious and non-religious sources of moral beliefs). This book would work well as a set of readings for graduate or advanced undergraduate seminars in philosophy of religion or ethics.

1 Thurow's argument has been anticipated in the literature (De Cruz and De Smedt, 2010, "Paley's ipod. The cognitive basis of the design argument within natural theology." Zygon, 45, 665-684 and De Smedt and De Cruz, 2011, "The cognitive appeal of the cosmological argument", Method and Theory in the Study of Religion, 23, 103-122).