Challenging Moral Particularism

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Mark Norris Lance, Matjaž Potrč, and Vojko Strahovnik (eds.), Challenging Moral Particularism, Routledge, 2008, 221pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415963770.

Reviewed by Rivka Weinberg, Scripps College


Moral Particularism, the claim that moral principles are neither necessary nor sufficient for moral action guidance, nor even, according to some, possible or plausible, is an important challenge to common sense morality and to many widely held, longstanding ethical theories. It is a view that demands a response and Lance, Potrč, and Strahovnik have edited a comprehensive and impressive array of responses to this potentially ground-breaking view.

One might think to respond to the challenge of moral particularism with something like, "intuitively, moral particularism is wrong." ("Particularly wrong," one might add.) But those who oppose moral particularism presumably favor a moral theory based on principles. It seems like those who think that morality is based on principles should be able to provide principled reasons for their view. And, in Lance et al.'s anthology, they do quite the job.

The anthology opens with some extremely forceful arguments against moral particularism, notable for their bracing clarity and argumentative punch. Hooker argues that even if moral wrongness is determined by reasons that cannot be captured by general principles, moral particularism does not follow because we may still have general duties expressed in the form of principles. Hooker invokes Ross to suggest that perhaps, when our duties conflict with each other, we must resort to making a particular judgment based on the facts particular to the conflict at hand. Audi argues in favor of this Rossian middle ground as well. He treats prima facie duties as general principles; when prima facie duties conflict, we exercise judgment to ascertain our final duties in the particular case.

Hooker further argues that there is no reason to conclude that moral principles cannot capture what Dancy takes to be enablers, disablers, intensifiers, and attenuators. For example, in the case of a promise, we can incorporate relevant factors into our principle regarding keeping one's promises by constructing a nuanced principle that says, if you promise freely, and not because facts have been deliberately misrepresented to you, etc., then you have a moral reason to keep your promise. Similarly, Väyrynen argues that moral principles can be structured or "hedged" to accommodate the various conditions to which they apply.

Perhaps most crucially, Hooker argues against moral particularism on epistemic and pragmatic grounds. He argues that moral knowledge does not begin with judgments about specific cases but, on the contrary, begins with learning general moral truths, e.g., there are moral reasons against harming others, lying, or stealing. Here, Hooker's description of moral education certainly seems more consistent with the way we teach our children about morality and the way we ourselves learned about morality. We do not present children with a particular case, as in, "Billy was upset with Bobby so he hit him. Does that seem wrong?" Rather, we say, "Billy, hitting is not an acceptable way to express anger; use your words." Maybe moral particularism would be more effective but that would be a radical experiment in moral education with perhaps frightening consequences. Who knows which particular moral judgments we might make if we had no principles to guide us. The right ones, moral particularists would claim. But Hooker argues that the unpredictability of a society governed by moral particularism undermines the social function of morality. Regardless of whether moral particularism leads to morally correct responses, the fact that it does so on a case by case basis will make it difficult to predict others' behavior (e.g., to trust them to keep their promises or not to slash our tires) and to predict reactions to our own behavior. It is advantageous for us that morality provides us with general reasons for beneficence, justice, honesty, etc. To lose our principles would therefore be quite a significant loss. (Dancy's default reasons don't serve this function because a default value is, as Dancy himself argues, "not the same as a normal value.")

We need not incur such a loss if we understand the nature of general principles. In an especially illuminating essay, Lance and Little explain that generalizations need not be exceptionless -- indeed they may be rife with exceptions, "porous" -- in order to do fundamental theoretical work. They argue that moral generalizations, like epistemological, semantic, or scientific generalizations, are important and defeasible. Under standard conditions, matches light when struck, lying is wrong, and so forth, but these generalizations admit of too many exceptions to list. Still, to understand the defeasible connection between lighting and striking that governs the concept match is to understand the privileged conditions and the ways in which they can vary, as well as the differences these variations make to lighting matches. If we understand the defeasible connection between striking and lighting that governs a match, we will know, for example, that matches won't light if they are wet. Applied to the moral case, we can say that lying is wrong but not when playing Diplomacy. (They note that lying in Diplomacy is not wrong because we have consented to a game yet such consent would be difficult to understand if the normal case was not that lying is wrong.). Thus, we can preserve moral generalizations when we understand the nature of generalizations.

Preserving moral principles can seem most vital when one turns to the epistemological difficulties posed by moral particularism. Both Väyrynen and Hooker question how moral particularism is learned. Lance and Little argue that a reason cannot simply be a matter of discrete discernment or of 'how things add up here,' as Dancy would have it, because reasons are related to generalizations insofar as something counts as explanatory when, epistemically, it can serve as the basis of an inference; yet, to do so it must hook into a generalization. McKeever and Ridge question the contingent a priori status of moral facts in particularist epistemology. They argue that moral particularism holds moral facts to be contingent, hence a posteriori, yet moral particularists also hold that moral properties are not reducible to descriptive properties. This means that particularists must claim that we have a posteriori knowledge of irreducible moral properties. This, they argue, is an implausible combination of views. How, they ask, can Dancy be right to claim that we have a priori knowledge of a posteriori matters? When we know that the fact that act a will promote pleasure is a reason to do it, we must also know that a will, in fact, promote pleasure. Knowing that a will, in fact, promote pleasure is a posteriori knowledge. Thus, because our knowledge of the facts that are reasons is a posteriori, the moral knowledge that said facts count as reasons is also a posteriori.

Dancy replies to McKeever and Ridge, arguing that just because knowing facts is a posteriori knowledge this does not mean that knowing how the facts relate to each other is also a posteriori knowledge. (This reply relies on a distinction between a conception of a posteriori as 'knowledge that can be gained by empirical means alone,' and a conception of a priori as 'knowledge that can be gained without some appeal to experience.') So, argues Dancy, the fact that someone is in trouble grounds the fact that I ought to help her but the fact that she is in trouble does not ground the "meta-fact" that her being in trouble is a reason for me to help her. That meta-fact is an a priori entailment, much like the fact that if something is a square it isn't a triangle is an a priori entailment. Dancy's reply clearly has some force but the strength of his reply depends on whether the moral relations he relies upon can plausibly be said to be relations of entailment, especially if we are to construct or understand these relations without access or appeal to any moral generalities. From understanding the meaning of the terms square and triangle, I know that if something is a square that entails that it is not a triangle, but from knowing that someone is in trouble, I am not confident that I know -- in the absence of knowledge of moral principles or generalities -- that the fact that she is in trouble entails that I have a reason to help her .

Against the backdrop of these powerful and persuasive arguments against moral particularism, discussion of competing forms of moral particularism can seem rather moot and some of the essays defending various forms of moral particularism fall a bit flat. A couple of the essays are focused on Dancy's views rather than on moral particularism per se. This can feel out of place in a collection whose focus is, for the most part, elsewhere. Miščević's discussion of whether Dancy's theory of thick concepts is compatible with his rejection of response-dispositionalism falls into this category as does McNaughton and Rawling's discussion of Dancy's objection to Moore's value holism and their defense of holistic value in terms of states of affairs.

Once we have read Lance and Little on defeasible generalizations, Hogan and Potrč's discussion of contextual semantics can seem somewhat beside the point. Horgan and Potrč argue, based on examples of "metaphysical lightweights," like corporations and universities (which are actual entities but do not exist in the world over and above entities like people, rooms, buildings, or land, yet cannot be reduced to people, rooms, buildings, or land), that semantic standards for affirmability are context dependent and cannot be formulated into exceptionless principles. This is taken to support particularism, including moral particularism, but if we don't think that we must posit exceptionless principles in order to retain useful and important moral principles and generalizations, this discussion will not count all that much in favor of moral particularism.

Bakhurst argues that moral particularism explains why humor can be funny in one context yet offensive in another in ways that are impossible to generalize. (I guess timing isn't everything.) Humor, he argues, is too nuanced, complex, and context dependent for us to formulate general principles regarding when something, e.g., cruelty, is funny and when it would be wrong or offensive to laugh at it. That judgment can only be made in particular cases, in particular contexts. This may well be true of humor but moral particularism may be false even if humor particularism is true.

Overall, Challenging Moral Particularism is an excellent collection of essays on a complex and important topic in moral theory. The essays are informative, engaging, interesting, and topical. They present us with first-rate philosophy on a topic of wide ranging significance.