Challenging the Modern Synthesis: Adaptation, Development, and Inheritance

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Philippe Huneman and Denis M. Walsh (eds.), Challenging the Modern Synthesis: Adaptation, Development, and Inheritance, Oxford University Press, 2017, 368pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199377176.

Reviewed by Ehud Lamm, Tel Aviv University


This collection joins a long parade of attempts to slay an aging, decrepit, beast. This beast of mythical status being the Modern Synthesis in evolutionary biology. As some of the authors in this collection note, it is far from clear whether these attempts do not in fact invigorate the beast, keeping it alert and nimble. As someone in the business of developing traps for the monster and its lookalikes, reading this collection I found myself identifying with the beast, clearly the underdog here as in many philosophy of biology circles, if not in Real Life, that is, in university biology departments. I also ended up not sure if everyone is chasing the same monster or maybe we are chasing shadows, possibly, but not certainly, the multiple shadows of one beast. So instead of engaging with specific arguments developed in individual chapters concerning the evolutionary significance of phenomena such as non-genetic inheritance or the Baldwin Effect, and covering a wide terrain, I mostly dedicate this review to what the monster looks like through the eyes of the hunters here assembled and to the roles philosophers of science play vis-à-vis the sciences they study. In other words, I will restrict this review to the various answers given throughout the collection to the question of the nature of the synthesis, the nature of the challenges, and the nature of the proposed or envisioned replacement.

Accurately reflecting three strands of challenges, the collection consists of three parts. Part I deals with adaptation and selection; part II with development; and part III with inheritance. The detailed introduction by the editors summarizes the debates and surveys the individual contributions.

More than a single event, the modern synthesis (MS) was a complex historical process: identifying when it occurred and what the synthesizing amounted to is beset with difficulties. Key to what became the MS were developments in the early decades of the 20th century in the mathematical analysis of changes in gene frequencies in populations, namely the genesis of population genetics. These developments reconciled Mendelism and natural selection. They were followed by the attempt to unify the perspective thus developed on adaptation within populations with work on macroevolution, that is with work on speciation in fields ranging from zoology and taxonomy to paleontology. It is in this latter phase that we find Dobzhansky's seminal 1937 book Genetics and the Origin of Species and, in 1942, Ernst Mayr's Systematics and the origin of species (giving Mayr's viewpoint as a zoologist) and Julian Huxley's Evolution: The modern synthesis (which gave the synthesis its name). A 1947 conference in Princeton sealed the deal, and the MS became the guiding framework for evolutionary biology. During this period significant institution building was taking place, coupled with theoretically significant gate-keeping. The Committee on Common Problems of Genetics, Paleontology, and Systematics, supported by a United States National Research Council, was launched in 1942 to establish a hitherto missing bridge between genetics and paleontology. It led to the formation of the Society for the Study of Evolution in 1946. The affiliated journal Evolution began appearing that same year. Mayr played key organizational roles in these developments that gave shape to the discipline of evolutionary biology.

It is worth noting for what follows that when reflecting on this history in 1998, Mayr wrote about the 1947 Princeton meeting that

only the developmental biologists stayed outside, insisting that the Darwinian theory was unable to provide an explanation of the evolutionary phenomena encountered by them. It was not until the 1970s and 1980s that molecular biology was able to integrate developmental biology into the synthesis.

Things look really different when reading this collection. Did the developmental biologists stay out or were they kept out? Were they ever integrated? The picture is much more complicated than Mayr allowed here. But in that same contribution, he claimed that by the 1980s the geneticists abandoned the gene as the object of selection, and only then was the synthesis complete. This ostensibly historical claim by Mayr is a slightly concealed and tendentious jab at what he termed 'beanbag genetics', found in population genetics, which focuses on additive genetic effects (thus disregarding gene interactions). Mayr opposed this approach, arguing for a more holistic view of genotypes and a focus on the phenotype and not the gene as the target of selection. Keeping in mind his critical role in the synthesis, it is worth noting how those challenging the MS likewise insist on the importance of the phenotype. Should we consider Mayr as among the challengers? Surely not. This is not the place to reflect on Mayr's views on the synthesis (they certainly should not be taken at face value), but they should caution us not to be too quick to judge when the synthesis occurred and what is and is not part of the synthesis and -- more importantly -- why.

What is (or was) the Modern Synthesis

A lot of the book's discussions raise challenges to the current standard or dominant view in evolutionary biology, rather than what the MS actually was or what was novel in the MS (e.g., what kind of synthesis it was). Take, for example, the issue of epigenetics and inheritance of acquired characters (discussed in the Introduction, and the focus of the chapters by Francesca Merlin, and Tobias Uller and Heikki Helanterä). Darwin, roughly speaking, downplayed the inheritance of acquired characters as the major way of explaining adaptation. Weismann was the one who established the view that the mechanisms of inheritance preclude the inheritance of acquired characters. Neither, of course, are new ideas of the synthesis, if this is taken to be the actual historical Modern Synthesis. Now, without a doubt, the rejection of soft inheritance is part of the synthesis. But what exactly this means may require separating neo-Darwinism and the MS, thinking about the fields that were synthesized, and so on. While now mostly used as a synonym for the MS, the term neo-Darwinism was introduced by Romanes several decades earlier to refer to Weismann's views. Put differently: is the challenge directed at the rejection of inheritance of acquired characters or is it directed at how this rejection manifests itself in the synthesis? This is not the project undertaken here. Arnaud Pocheville and Étienne Danchin explicitly chose to use neo-Darwinism as a foil, rather than the MS, saying the latter was a version of neo-Darwinism. It seems to me that the most one should be comfortable saying is that the MS contained or endorsed a version of neo-Darwinism. Even this is contestable.

So would a better title for this collection be Challenging the Current Synthesis, or Challenging the Hardened Synthesis (echoing Stephen Jay Gould's helpful metaphor)? I don't think this would have decreased my unease, because then I would have expected papers exploring how in practice these challenges are handled, often piecemeal and in falsifiable ways, by practitioners in various fields of contemporary biology. This is hardly the kind of philosophical engagement we mostly find here. As we have come to expect in philosophy of biology, most of the discussion is of specific aspects of current biological thought, and arguments are made to show that they are no longer tenable. These discussions, notably about the role of development in evolution (the focus of part II) and about non-genetic inheritance (the focus of part III), contribute to long running debates in the field. But what about the MS itself?

The editors are well aware of this difficulty, noting in the introduction that "the nature of the modern synthesis is part of the narrative of 20th-century biology that is constantly being revised and rewritten." That being said, they emphasize the existence of a cohesive "if somewhat diffuse" body of theory and commitments. This must be true on some level -- after all, the proponents of the synthesis put significant effort into articulating these shared commitments. However, it is harder to justify focusing on this diffuse entity when trying to draw a more fine-grained picture of contemporary practice, which does not necessarily challenge the synthesis yet may nonetheless empirically or theoretically problematize its core commitments, explanatory style, inferential schemes, research questions, and so on. A philosopher of science may wonder about the best way of characterizing what is going on in biological practice. Notions of normal science and anomalies, degenerating research programs, and such, do not seem to really capture either the synthesis or its afterlife. Philippe Huneman and Alan Love in their respective chapters address such issues; the time is certainly ripe for a sustained philosophical discussion of the contemporary structure of evolutionary thought. The historian of science, on her part, confronted with the book might feel the need to reflect on the role of anthologies such as this one in entrenching a particular narrative of the synthesis, whether consciously or not.

The editors suggest that if empirical matters are not under dispute then the controversy must be conceptual, and by implication the remit of philosophers and theoreticians, the kind of arguments found throughout the collection. It is often not clear that empirical matters are not under dispute, however, and interpretation of results affects burden of proof. My anecdotal experience suggests that practitioners may feel that debates about evidence are in fact still critical and that reconceptualizations urged, so to speak, from the outside, may be premature. Exploring the raging debates about specific molecular mechanisms of epigenetic inheritance might have been instructive. On the other hand, many of the papers that themselves exemplify conceptual constraints and desiderata in these debates, can serve as fodder for elucidating the relations between theory and empirical results in biology. The Introduction might also be understood to suggest taking the molecularization of biology to be part of the synthesis. Yet, the synthesis was prior to molecularization, which with historical irony may very well be considered one of the challenges to the synthesis. In particular, the elucidation of the molecular underpinnings of epigenetic inheritance has driven a lot of the debates about the need to rethink the conceptualization of inheritance and rethink Lamarckian notions more broadly.

As to the challenges, the editors characterize them as challenging the reconceptualizations ushered in under the modern synthesis, either redefining the processes of evolution or the relation between them (p. 5). This wording seems to suggest returning to and reevaluating pre-synthesis views. While this sometimes happens, as when David Depew considers Spencer's views, Stéphane Schmitt surveys historical views on serial homology, or Merlin gives an organism-level view of inheritance, this characterization is overly restrictive. And it will typically be historically Whiggish. Certainly, the contributions of both the late Patrick Bateson and Stuart Newman discussed below raise issue with commitments already found in Darwin.

Challenging the challengers, synthesizing the synthesizers

The Introduction highlights the genocentrism of the synthesis, and (portrayed as a consequence) the disentanglement of development and inheritance (p. 4). Both themes are touched on in most chapters. Population genetics was a fundamental building block of the synthesis, and conceptualizes evolutionary change as the change in the frequency of genotypes in a population. Challengers often see themselves as advocating an evolutionary theory as a theory of phenotypes rather than of genotypes (e.g., Uller and Helanterä on p. 304).

Depew (p. 53) is right to emphasize that the synthesis is flexible and has accommodated a range of facts, mechanisms, and research programs. "It has been capacious enough to embrace a Dobzhansky, a Mayr, a Ford, a Dawkins, and even a Gould." The chief conceptual boundary he nevertheless identifies in the synthesis is the commitment to transgenerational natural selection as the cause of "the adaptations that organisms considered as members of adapted populations evolve." Distinguishing between cases in which this commitment is discarded, revised, or extended allows him to characterize various post-synthesis ideas. I also agree with him that a developmentalist strain was discernible throughout in the synthesis, making some proposals for extending the synthesis less radical than they are sometimes portrayed to be.

Huneman agrees that the synthesis per se was more complex than many purported challenges allow, and uses words Huxley wrote to Mayr in 1951 (that is, fairly late) to characterize the core commitments of the synthesis: "Natural selection, acting on the heritable variation provided by mutation and recombination of a Mendelian generic constitution, is the main agency of biological evolution." Huneman argues that the degree to which one accepts (is committed to?) Mendelian genetic inheritance and to natural selection as the main agency (cause?) determines the space of controversies in evolutionary biology. Depew, in his contribution, says that since Pigliucci and Muller remain committed to natural selection being the cause of adaptation, they are entitled to say that they are extending the synthesis, not replacing it (p. 57). Huneman, in turn, ends up arguing that referring to these proposals as extensions is misleading since, rather than building on top, or adding, they amount to reshuffling the explanatory scheme of evolutionary biology (p. 87). He concludes that directed variation as such does not support a switch in explanatory schemes, only heritable adaptive variation (p. 96). Further developing this line of thought, Pocheville and Danchin take the core tenet of neo-Darwinism to be blind variation: that heritable variations do not arise because of their adaptive value (p. 111). They argue that blindness is an explanatory principle as much as it is an empirical claim. It is, they claim, an explanatory choice "segregating out of the theory other (compatible) explanatory schemes" (p. 129). But is such a choice merely a default assumption or a typically useful idealization? They of course realize that blindness of variation is not independent of empirical results. It would have been interesting to reflect more on how the explanatory choice affects the kinds of empirical results and their interpretation, affecting in consequence the empirical challenges that are encountered and considered to be relevant.

Like Huneman, Love is concerned with the structure of evolutionary theory and with characterizing the challenges that are being raised. He resists the container metaphor, often used to support the idea that challenges to the standard view call for including mechanisms and theoretical notions that the synthesis excluded. Instead, he focuses on the structure of the theory and ultimately argues that developmental challenges to standard evolutionary theory do not suggest an alternative overarching organization of evolutionary theory, but rather point toward a pluralist stance about the structure of the theory. He notes that one consequence that follows from this analysis is that various of the challenges he discusses may in fact challenge one another.

In his beautiful contribution, Bateson extends the discussion noting that the 1930s neo-Darwinist orthodoxy was committed to three claims: speciation was the result of a slow process of natural selection; organisms were passive, mutations driving the evolutionary process; and developmental processes were irrelevant to an understanding of evolution. The transition from the discussions of adaptation in the previous chapters to speciation is an important one. It reminds us that the synthesis was as much about the relation between micro- and macro-evolution as it was about adaptation. This was critical for achieving the goal of synthesizing disparate fields, such as zoology and paleontology, and reconciling and combining the evidence that they provided. The importance Bateson assigns to the commitment to the passivity of the organism (which is related to the exclusion of development) is also significant as it highlights what it is at stake. Beyond being epistemically economical (as Pocheville and Danchin describe the commitment to blind variation), a positivist methodological commitment (of the sort Walsh extracts from Jacques Monod), or a question of explanatory scheme, the passivity of the organism is a stance that some biologists have throughout the history of evolutionary theory found fundamentally unacceptable. This tension, however, precedes the synthesis. Bateson discusses four ways in which the activities of organisms play a role in the evolution of their descendants: choice (of mates, of prey); control of the environment (think of niche construction); adaptability (think of the Baldwin Effect or the views West-Eberhard); and mobility.

Newman also frames his contribution as an argument against what he takes to be a core metaphysical aspect of evolutionary theory. As he makes clear, he finds the original sin already in Darwin; it did not originate in the synthesis. Newman's objection is to the "philosophical idealism" of evolutionary theory, embodied in the belief that there must exist a genotype-phenotype code. It manifests itself in genetic determinism and the sidelining of development. Physical considerations, key to Newman's own scientific work, are taken to be mere background conditions. Like Bateson's list, the empirical challenges highlighted by Newman may be surprising to those familiar with the big ticket items of the philosophical debate. They are the conservation of the developmental-genetic toolkit over hundreds of millions of years, across radically different body plans; the Avalon and Cambrian explosions; and the recurrent "embryonic hourglass" of animal evolution, in which diversification is primarily at early and later stages of development, with a conserved phylotypic stage in between.

Walsh may be understood as arguing for an alternative candidate to Bateson's focus on passivity and Newman's focus on idealism. He takes the core issue to be a tension between chance and purposefulness, and explicitly raises the question whether the privileging of chance (i.e., blind variation and selection) is a metaphysical commitment or a methodological artifact. It is interesting that he chose to introduce the tension through the reflections of Monod in Chance and Necessity (1971, that is, from twenty years after the quote from Huxley used by Huneman), thereby giving a third illustration of how the tensions articulated by Bateson and Newman are felt by practicing biologists. Walsh concludes that far from it being a legitimate methodological constraint, the privileging of chance is no longer even supported on empirical grounds. (Though, I would emphasize, methodological constraints should affect what are taken as valid empirical results.) He explores the prospects for what he calls "neo-Aristotelian" evolutionary biology, which prioritizes purpose, in contrast with the "neo-Democritean" modern synthesis. Two related issues that I think could have been addressed head on in this important chapter are the role of organization and whether chance, reflected in the supposed blindness of variation, may itself evolve. The connection between these issues is particularly apparent when considering the organization of the genome. The degree to which the genome is modular, that genes are linked on chromosomes, and so on, affects how mutation events (including chromosome-level events such as inversions and translocations) are experienced by the organism and can be reacted to. This points to the often neglected fact that chance and the purposeful way in which chance is experienced by the organism are distinct, and indicates how changes in the organization of the biological system during evolution can change their relation (see Lamm, 2011).

Uller and Halanterä present a detailed and useful taxonomy of conceptualizations of heredity in evolutionary theory. They discuss four perspectives: heredity as transmission genetics; as parent-offspring covariance; as intergenerational information transfer; and finally, heredity as developmental process. Significantly from the point of view of my concerns here, they note how each perspective may dominate specific research communities, such as evolutionary population genetics (which is dominated by transmission genetics) or behavioral ecology (dominated by intergenerational information transfer). However, this is not their main focus; they are mostly concerned with the structure of an extended evolutionary theory. On this question they argue for an extended evolutionary theory as theory of phenotypes, emphasizing both plasticity and mechanisms of heredity.


The evolutionary synthesis was, at its core, an attempt to offer a comprehensive framework for diverse fields of evolutionary biology, from population genetics to paleontology, zoology, botany, microbiology, and more. The success of formulating such a framework is a proof by construction that it is possible. This remarkable achievement -- theoretical, empirical, but also sociological and disciplinary -- is mostly taken for granted by focusing on challenges. Reading the anthology made me stop and reflect on that achievement. But can the synthesis, or what remains from it in current practice, survive the challenges presented here and elsewhere? Love quotes the eminent population geneticist, Michael Lynch, who said: "I think a lot of us are happy with the fundamental framework to do the explaining [of what is left unexplained]". Mayr (1988) similarly said that the controversies that remained were "within the synthetic theory", not from without. In yet another irony, it might seem that the strength of the synthesis is that it can take most of the challenges in stride. Pinpointing where this possibly undeserved optimism falls apart requires us to say where modifications are not enough: which proposed pluralism cannot be tolerated by the synthesis. Not which pluralism will not be tolerated, but which logically cannot be. We should explore where pluralism and unification clash. It also behooves us to explicitly say when the debate is about empirical matters, about the interpretation of evidence, or alternatively about research agendas and resource allocation.

Seeing myself among the challengers I am a bit surprised by my unease. But I note these concerns more as a testament to the thought-provoking nature of this collection. If I had had one suggestion for the editors it would have been to organize the collection differently, highlighting three kinds of endeavors: (1) analyses of the structure of evolutionary theory and practice (Love; Huneman); (2) analyses of the guiding epistemological, methodological, and metaphysical foundations of evolutionary theory (Depew, Bateson, Newman, Walsh); (3) discussions of fundamental concepts (Pocheville and Danchin on blind variation; Minelli on evolvability; Merlin, and Uller and Halanterä on heredity; Schmitt on serial homology). A lot of work in philosophy of biology belongs to the third category; there is plenty of room for more of the first two kinds of engagement with evolutionary biology.

If ever there was a case calling for integrated history and philosophy of science, it would be evolutionary synthesis. Much as the philosophical and theoretical contributions in this collection and elsewhere are important, it is time we collectively moved beyond the confines of this work and engaged once again with the broader questions concerning the structure of evolutionary biology and its fundamental commitments, questions that have been asked in the past but will benefit from renewed attention. The chapters here that attempt to do this, notably the discussions of passivity, idealism, and purpose, point the way forward and should be read by all philosophers of biology.

Before ending this review, I must note that out of thirteen contributors only one is a woman. This is unfortunate.


I thank Snait Gissis, Paul Griffiths, and Adam Krashniak for their helpful suggestions.


Lamm, Ehud. 2011. The Metastable Genome: A Lamarckian Organ in a Darwinian World? In: Transformations of Lamarckism: From Subtle Fluids to Molecular Biology., edited by Eva Jablonka and Snait Gissis. MIT Press.

Mayr, E. 1998. Preface to 1998 edition. In: The Evolutionary Synthesis: Perspectives on the Unification of Biology., edited by Ernst Mayr and William B. Provine. Harvard University Press.