Chance and Temporal Asymmetry

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Alastair Wilson (ed.), Chance and Temporal Asymmetry, Oxford University Press, 2014, 297pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673421.

Reviewed by Nina Emery, Brown University


This collection of fourteen essays takes up questions about the nature of chance and of temporal asymmetry. Many are important extensions of well-known projects -- there are contributions from L. A. Paul on temporal experience, Jessica Wilson on the Humean denial of necessary connections, David Wallace on probability in quantum physics, and David Albert on the Mentaculus. But all are of interest as standalone pieces, and all include new ideas that address significant gaps in the existing literature.

Readers who are not already well versed in the relevant literature will benefit from a careful reading of Alastair Wilson's introduction, which clearly and concisely reviews recent developments in philosophical thinking about chance and temporal asymmetry and helps situate the contributions with respect to these developments. As Wilson makes clear, chance and temporal asymmetry are interesting topics in their own right, and the volume's papers, insofar as they address one or the other of these topics, are of obvious philosophical import. But there are also interesting connections between chance and temporal asymmetry, and work on both topics increasingly relies on these connections. In this way the volume as a whole serves as a valuable introduction to the ways in which work on chance can and should inform work on temporal asymmetry, and vice-versa.

Perhaps the most straightforward (though certainly not the only) way of understanding the connection between chance and temporal asymmetry is as follows. Begin with the observation that the world is temporally asymmetric in this sense: many commonly observed sequences of events are never observed to happen in reverse. Vases fall off tables and shatter of the floor, but scattered shards of glass on the floor never gather themselves together in a vase and jump up onto tables. Ice cubes left on the kitchen counter melt, but puddles of room temperature water on the kitchen counter never grow steadily colder and form into ice cubes. And so on. Physicists tell us that these everyday asymmetries are instances of a more general pattern, namely that the entropy of a (isolated or pseudo-isolated) system always increases over time (provided that the system is not already at equilibrium). Call this pattern the asymmetry of entropy.

Philosophers and physicists alike agree that there must be some explanation for the asymmetry of entropy. And this explanation must be compatible with the fact that the underlying dynamical laws appear to be such that it is possible for entropy to decrease over time. The standard way of providing such an explanation appeals to probability: the fundamental dynamics may be such that it is possible for entropy to decrease, but we never observe entropy decreasing. Why not? Because even if it is possible for entropy to decrease, it is extremely unlikely.

Note that whatever else you want to say about this explanation -- I will call it the standard explanation of the asymmetry of entropy or the standard explanation in what follows -- the probabilities that it appeals to had better be objective probabilities, or chances. That is, they had better be probabilities that are determined independently of what we happen to believe or have evidence for. What we happen to believe or have evidence for surely plays no role whatsoever in explaining why, for instance, vases break but broken glass never knits itself back together into a vase.

One way to approach this volume's contributions as a whole is to see them as an extended discussion of the costs and benefits of the standard explanation. On the one hand, whether this explanation succeeds depends in part on whether we can give a plausible metaphysics of chance in general and the sort of chances that play a role in the standard explanation in particular. On the other hand, there is a well-established tradition of trying to explain all apparent temporal asymmetry in terms of the asymmetry of entropy. Insofar as that project succeeds, even those of us who are otherwise suspicious of the chances that show up in the standard explanation might be willing to accept them into our metaphysics, since the benefits would be so significant.

The volume begins with an essay by Toby Handfield and Alastair Wilson that addresses one particular way in which we might find the standard explanation of the asymmetry of entropy worrying. As noted above, the explanation appeals to chances, but the explanation is also supposed to work even if the fundamental dynamical laws turn out to be deterministic. This is especially worrying because many philosophers endorse a broadly Lewisian theory of chance in the sense that they take the defining characteristic of chances to be that they constrain rational credence in something like the way described in Lewis's Principal Principle (see Lewis 1980). But Lewis was also explicitly committed to incompatibilism about chance and deterministic laws. Indeed such incompatibilism appears to follow from some versions of the Principal Principle itself.

In their contribution, Handfield and Wilson present a theory of chance that is still broadly Lewisian in the sense described above, but which also makes chance compatible with deterministic laws. In brief, their proposal is that chances are fixed relative to a contextual parameter, which they call the evidence base. Different evidence bases generate different chance functions. When the laws are deterministic, the evidence base that consists of the complete history of the world at some time plus the laws of nature -- the evidence base that Lewis had in mind -- will generate a chance function that contains only trivial chances. But other evidence bases will generate non-trivial chance functions. Presumably it is these other, non-trivial, chance functions that play a role in the standard explanation of the asymmetry of entropy.

Perhaps the most obvious question to have about this sort of proposal is: what happens if the different chance functions generated by these different evidence bases conflict? If chances are supposed to constrain rational credences, then conflicting chances will generate conflicting constraints on rational credences. In the next paper, Christopher Meacham dubs this problem the conflicts problem, and clearly sets out the various ways in which it may arise for anyone who endorses multiple autonomous chance functions. This group includes not only Handfield and Wilson, but also the advocates of compatibilist Humean theories of chance, like those found in Hoefer 2007 and Callender and Cohen 2009. Meacham's paper is followed by a response from Carl Hoefer, in which Hoefer defends his theory of chance from the conflicts problem by appealing to a certain sort of admissibility constraint in his version of the Principal Principle.

This initial exchange is followed by a series of papers that can be seen as taking up more general questions about the nature of chance. First, Wolfgang Schwarz takes up a long-standing challenge issued by Lewis, according to which any theory of chance must explain why chances satisfy the Principal Principle. Schwarz attempts to show how several Humean theories of chance, including the fatalist theory (which is 1 for every event that actually happens and 0 for events that do not actually happen), certain kinds of relative frequency theories, and the best-systems analysis, can meet this challenge.

Next Alan Hájek attempts to diffuse some of the mystery surrounding chance by demonstrating how, using only very broad comparative judgments about the chances of some event, we can identify other events whose chance is any number you chose to any degree of accuracy you specify. Insofar as his magic trick (that's his characterization) makes the fact that chances come in degrees less mysterious, it shows that chances are no more or less objectionable than other modal notions. This is followed by an essay by Aidon Lyon that takes as its focus propensity analyses of chance. Although Lyon begins by demonstrating how a standard objection to such analyses -- Humphrey's paradox -- can be avoided if one is willing to endorse a non-standard axiomatization of probability theory, he eventually presents a generalized version of the objection that closes this loophole.

Finally, there is a paper by Antony Eagle in which he asks whether chance itself might be temporally asymmetric -- in particular, whether only future events can have some non-trivial chance of occurring. (This would, of course, be a worry for those who wish to both (i) understand all temporal asymmetry in terms of the asymmetry of entropy and (ii) use chances to explain the asymmetry of entropy.) Eagle's answer is that it is not part of the concept of chance itself that it be temporally asymmetric in the relevant way. However there is, according to Eagle, an important connection between chance and causation. And this connection, combined with the general causal structure of our world, generates the result that past events rarely, if ever, have a non-trivial chance of occurring.

After Eagle's paper, the focus of the volume shifts from questions about the nature of chance to questions about the details of the standard explanation of the asymmetry of entropy and the prospects for using that explanation to explain temporal asymmetry tout court. Many of these later papers address a particular version of the standard explanation that has been developed in detail by David Albert and Barry Loewer (see, e.g. Albert 2000 and Loewer 2012).

According to Albert and Loewer the probabilities that show up in the standard explanation of the asymmetry of entropy are part of a probability distribution called the Mentaculus. The form of the Mentaculus depends on what the fundamental dynamical laws turn out to be. In the most-often discussed case, where the fundamental dynamical laws are the laws of classical mechanics, the Mentaculus is a probability distribution over possible initial states of the universe that has the following form: (i) it assigns zero probability to any possible initial state that is not a low entropy state (this is usually called the Past Hypothesis) and (ii) it is uniform over the remaining possible initial states. According to Albert and Loewer, this probability distribution can be used to explain not only the asymmetry of entropy, but all scientific phenomena. As Albert puts it in this volume, the Mentaculus "in principle exhausts the content of science" (p. 159). (More details on the Mentaculus can be found in Wilson's introduction.)

The section begins with two papers that are focused on our experience of temporal asymmetry. In the first, Albert discusses the way in which the Mentaculus can explain the fact that it appears to us that what happens in the present can influence what happens in the future but not what happens in the past. Since the publication of Albert 2000, several philosophers, most notably Elga (2001) and Frisch (2010), have put forward examples that purport to show that what happens in the past will, on Albert's account, sometimes counterfactually depend on what happens in the present. Albert concedes that such examples succeed, but points out that the situations they describe are ones of which we should not expect to be aware. Thus although, on his view, the temporal asymmetry of counterfactual dependence is not universal, Albert can still explain why that asymmetry appears to us to be universal.

Next comes an essay by L. A. Paul, which should be required reading for those interested in how phenomenology and results from cognitive science can and should guide our best metaphysics. In particular, Paul focuses the ways in which we experience time itself as having a direction or orientation and evaluates the prospects for explaining this experience without claiming that time itself is fundamentally directed or oriented. Such explanations, Paul suggests, might appeal to an analogy with the sorts of illusions that cognitive scientists have long recognized as arising in experience as of certain sorts of motion through space and certain sorts of causal phenomena.

The next three papers critically examine the relationship between the Mentaculus and scientific theories other than classical mechanics. First there is a paper by David Wallace that, in addition to serving as an excellent introduction to probability in physics more generally, attempts to situate the Mentaculus, or something like it, with respect to our best interpretations of quantum mechanical phenomena. This project is not straightforward, and Wallace suggests that significant adjustments to the Mentaculus may therefore be necessary. This is followed by contributions from Mathias Frisch and Brad Weslake that ask whether the Mentaculus really can explain the scientific phenomena found in the special sciences. The details of their arguments are far more nuanced than I can do justice to here. Suffice it to say that both authors suggest that at the very least there are alternative explanations of special science phenomena that are better than the explanations given by the Mentaculus.

Finally there are two contributions whose importance goes far beyond the sorts of concerns that draw the volume's essays together, but are nonetheless relevant to those concerns. The first, by Jessica Wilson, argues that Lewis's theory of counterfactuals does not require that Hume's Dictum -- the thesis that there are no metaphysically necessary connections -- be true. Along the way she questions the common assumption that counterfactual dependence is straightforwardly and universally temporally asymmetric. In the second, Alexander Bird presents an argument that has the surprising conclusion that whatever is true is necessarily true. The argument hinges on the claim that either there are no initial conditions of the universe, or they are fixed by the laws of nature.

All of these papers are of the highest quality, and all of them take up innovative and interesting philosophical questions. Taken together they amount to a significant advance in our understanding of chance, of temporal asymmetry, and of the connections between the two topics.


Albert, D. Z. (2000). Time and Chance. Harvard University Press.

Cohen, J. and Callender, C., (2009). A Better Best-System Account of Lawhood. Philosophical Studies, 145, 1-34.

Elga, A. (2001). Statistical Mechanics and the Asymmetry of Counterfactual Dependence. Philosophy of Science Supplementary Volume, 68, S313-24

Frisch, M. (2010). Does a Low-Entropy Constraint Prevent us from Influence the Past? In G. Ernst and A. Hütteman (eds), Time, Chance, and Reduction: Philosophical Aspects of Statistical Mechanics (pp. 13-33). Cambridge University Press.

Hoefer, C. (2007). The Third Way on Objective Probability: A Sceptic's Guide to Objective chance. Mind, 116(463), 549-96.

Lewis, D. K. (1980). A Subjectivist's Guide to Objective Chance. In R. C. Jeffrey (ed.), Studies in Inductive Logic and Probability (vol. 2). University of California Press.

Loewer, B. (2012). The Emergence of Time's Arrows and Special Science Laws from Physics. Interface Focus, 2(1), 13-19.