Chance in Evolution

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Grant Ramsey and Charles H. Pence (eds.), Chance in Evolution, University of Chicago Press, 2016, 359pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226401881.

Reviewed by Timothy Shanahan, Loyola Marymount University


Ever since the eminent astronomer Sir John Herschel over a century-and-a-half ago dismissed Darwin's theory of evolution by natural selection as "the law of higglety-pigglety," the role of chance in Darwin's theory and in evolution itself has been controversial. Arguably even more than natural selection, it is the chance element in Darwin's theory that distinguishes it from previous evolutionary theories and that leads a substantial percentage of Americans to reject it. It also turns out to be an especially vexed conceptual issue for biologists and philosophers trying to understand the processes and products of evolution. But what, precisely, is "chance" within the context of evolutionary biology, and what forms does it take in evolutionary processes?

This book brings together twelve essays by historians, philosophers, biologists, and a theologian to address such questions. Following an introduction by the editors explaining the significance of the book's topic and highlighting its contents, the book consists of three parts, dealing with: 1. the historical development and religious and philosophical implications of chance in evolution; 2. chance in the processes of evolution; and 3. contingency in the history of life. These broad topics provide a loose thematic unity to each part of the book while leaving plenty of opportunity for essays to span historical, conceptual, and empirical issues. Following a summary of each of the volume's essays I'll conclude with some general remarks about the scope and quality of the book as a whole and the extent to which it achieves its editors' stated goals.

Part 1 kicks off with David J. Depew's wide-ranging "Contingency, Chance, and Randomness in Ancient, Medieval, and Modern Biology." According to Depew, ever since Aristotle contingency had been recognized as an inescapable characteristic of living systems, e.g., in the imperfect processes of reproduction. Darwin, of course, recognized the importance of contingency and made chance central to his theory in at least two ways: variations arise "by chance" in that they do not arise because they would be useful to their possessors; and any given variation that arises in a population has at best "a chance" of being passed on to offspring. These chance features introduce a degree of "randomness," understood as "inherent unpredictability" (p. 20) into evolutionary processes. One might wish for a more systematic exposition of these key concepts and how they relate to one another. But as the essay aims (and I would say succeeds in its aim) to illuminate the historical/conceptual development of biology, perhaps the lack of systematicity in this account aptly mirrors that of the contingent historical development of biology itself.

In his long and densely argued "Chance and Chances in Darwin's Early Theorizing and in Darwinian Theory Today," Jonathan Hodge argues that although statistical thinking in science came into its own in the 19th century -- precisely when Darwin was formulating his theory -- such theoretical innovations played surprisingly little role in Darwin's theorizing. There is no evidence that Darwin thought that any of the processes involved in evolution were genuinely indeterministic. Rather, "Darwin held the most common view of his day: that chanciness in causal theories is due not to any gappy indeterminacy in the causal order of nature but rather to gappy incompleteness in our knowledge of that order" (p. 40). One might naturally expect Darwinian theory to have changed radically in the aftermath of the probabilistic revolution, but according to Hodge this did not happen. Despite much contemporary talk within evolutionary biology of fitness and of selection being a probabilistic effect of various non-selective causes, natural selection continues to be thought of -- as indeed Darwin thought of it -- as a probabilistic cause of evolutionary change.

In "Chance in the Modern Synthesis," Anya Plutynski, Kenneth Blake Vernon, Lucas John Matthews, and Daniel Molter survey the period -- roughly 1920 to 1950 -- in which the discipline of evolutionary biology was formulated and consolidated. In workmanlike fashion, they identify and discuss five different senses of chance at play in the synthesis -- indeterminism, randomness, probability, contingency, and non-directionality -- by examining their appearance in key works of the most influential biologists of the synthesis period. "Chance" usually referred to the random variations upon which selection operates, or to the probability of survival and reproduction of organisms having certain traits. Chance as causal indeterminism, contingency, and non-directionality played less prominent roles. The authors are circumspect about drawing any general conclusions from their survey for contemporary issues in the philosophy of biology; they do, however, take the synthesis biologists to have endorsed Darwin's view of natural selection as a probabilistic cause of evolution (p. 101) -- a conclusion in line with Hodge's essay as well.

In "Is it Providential, by Chance? Christian Objections to the Role of Chance in Darwinian Evolution," J. Matthew Ashley examines two challenges that Darwinism poses to Christian theology. Doesn't Darwinism's reliance on chance undercut arguments from the appearance of design in living things to the existence of a Designer? How can God's providential purposes be vouchsafed in a world in which chance processes introduce real contingency? We learn through detailed case studies that the Protestant theologian Charles Hodge and the Roman Catholic Cardinal Christoph Schönborn both insisted that chance as it functions in Darwinian biology is incompatible with Christian doctrines, and therefore must be rejected. Philosophers might hope that such case studies would be harnessed in support of more general conclusions about the (in)compatibility of Darwinian evolution and Christian theology. But the closest we get is a concluding section issuing a caution about drawing too confident of a dichotomy between God's purposes and the messiness of history with a supporting quotation from Stephen Jay Gould.

In the intriguingly-titled "Does Darwinian Evolution Mean We Are Here by Chance?" Michael Ruse ostensibly proposes to address precisely the sort of question to which non-specialists are likely to want an answer when thinking about the implications of Darwin's theory. In Ruse's lively telling, before Darwin belief in the specialness of humans was a given, even among ardent evolutionists. "Then came Charles Darwin, who spoiled everything" (p. 125). How did he spoil everything? Remarkably, "he showed it was possible to be an evolutionist without any beliefs in improvement" (p. 130). What does this have to do with chance in evolution? It is unclear. After figuring prominently in the title, 'chance' barely makes another appearance. The essay is mainly about progress -- a topic on which Ruse had already contributed mightily. Undoubtedly, the issues of progress and chance are interrelated, but we don't here find out how. This is a pity and quite disappointing because probably no one has a better command than Ruse of the relevant issues, both historically and philosophically, and he is able to communicate effectively to a broad audience.

Part 2 kicks off with Michael Strevens' "The Reference Class Problem in Evolutionary Biology: Distinguishing Selection from Drift." Biologists typically consider selection and drift to be distinct causes of evolutionary change. Neutral evolution is often cited as a paradigm case of drift: genes that are selectively neutral (e.g., because they have no, or selectively equivalent, phenotypic effects) can drift from generation to generation, with their relative numbers changing "by chance." Problems arise, however, in trying to distinguish drift from selection more generally. Rather than trying to define 'drift', as others have, Strevens proposes to go deeper by articulating and clarifying foundational issues concerning reference classes that he argues are prior to proposed solutions to the specific conceptual problem. By comparing processes in biological systems to simple gambling devices and the systems treated in statistical mechanics, he aims to clarify, without completely solving, the key conceptual issues. Given the conceptual sophistication on display, this essay is likely to be of interest mainly to philosophers of science.

The idea that genetic mutations are "random" is a dogma of evolutionary biology. But in what sense are they random? In her lucid contribution, "Weak Randomness at the Origin of Biological Variation: The Case of Genetic Mutations," Francesca Merlin proposes to identify "the proper notion of chance needed to characterize genetic mutations at the genome level" (p. 178) -- irrespective of their consequences. "Randomness" is construed epistemologically as an outcome of a series of events that is unpredictable. An event is said to be weakly random if it is the result of a probabilistic sampling process but fails to be indiscriminate, fails to be invariant over time, or both, e.g., when the characteristics of balls drawn from an urn bias the probability of their being drawn, when the balls are not put back into the urn for subsequent draws, or both. Merlin argues that mutational biases revealed in recent molecular genetics show that all mutations are weakly, and none are strongly, random events. Such an understanding, she suggests, has important implications for the way in which genetic mutations are modeled and their occurrences predicted.

Countless examples attest to the fact that evolutionary processes in distantly related lineages often result in strikingly similar phenotypes. Why? The standard Darwinian answer is that such convergent evolution results from natural selection hitting upon similar solutions to similar problems. According to Thomas Lenormand, Luis-Miguel Chevin, and Thomas Bataillon, we should not be hasty in drawing this conclusion. In "Parallel Evolution: What Does It (Not) Tell Us and Why Is It (Still) Interesting?" they argue that we also need to consider "mutationist" views according to which "the process of mutation determines and orients evolution at least as much as natural selection does" (p. 198). Even if they are right about that (the essay is rich in citations to the biological literature, but conceptually underdeveloped regarding that key claim), how these issues bear on the central topic of "chance in evolution" is never explicitly addressed. This is a pity, because in principle a detailed examination of convergent evolution could pay large dividends in our attempt to grasp the nature and significance of chance in evolution.

Biologists like François Jacob and Gould emphasized s the inescapably historical and radically contingent nature of evolutionary processes, treating them as necessary concomitants of one another. In "Contingent Evolution: Not by Chance Alone," the first essay in Part 3, Eric Desjardins is concerned to pry these two ideas apart. Suppose that initially a population has a trait, G0. Some change in the environment occurs, and by chance some sub-populations acquire mutation M1, whereas others acquire the equally advantageous mutation M2. Suppose that each of those sub-populations by chance acquires an additional equally good mutation, M3 or M4. By chance, about half of the sub-populations thereby would have acquired M3 and about half M4, regardless of which mutation they had previously. In this abstract scenario, chance played a role, but not history (p. 231). Hence chance and history are distinct. This is not just an abstract possibility. Hypotheses that discriminate between chance and history in producing evolutionary phenomena have been tested experimentally (pp. 233-235).

If evolution is a highly contingent process, one might expect quite different evolutionary outcomes even from identical starting points. Conducting microbial evolution experiments in the lab makes testing this expectation feasible. As Zachary D. Blount reports in "History's Windings in a Flask: Microbial Experiments into Evolutionary Contingency," such experiments warrant five conclusions: 1. evolutionary contingency is constrained by the fact that selection is capable of driving similar outcomes; 2. parallelism at the level of organismic fitness can co-exist with differences at the genotypic level; 3. "Prior history . . . impacts future evolution by determining that from which variation arises, and thereby what variation can reasonably arise" (p. 259); 4. historical factors may have significant cumulative effects over time; and 5. it is important that evolutionary biologists and philosophers collaborate in studying evolutionary contingency with conceptual work by philosophers being used by evolutionary biologists to formulate more precise empirical questions and experiments to study contingency in extant biological systems.

Microbes can be put to use in studying the effects of evolutionary contingency in other ways as well, as Betul Kacar reports in "Rolling the Dice Twice: Evolving Reconstructed Ancient Proteins in Extant Organisms." She replaced a gene in E. coli with its 500-million-year-old reconstructed ancestral counterpart, a procedure she describes as like "replaying a particular track on the tape of life within the context of the modern organism" (p. 273). She acknowledges limitations of this approach, beginning with the fact that the ancient resurrected gene is being studied in a biological system that only appeared millions of years after its ancient counterpart. Nonetheless, she argues that by designing experiments in which the same ancestral gene is placed in multiple replicate populations under identical environmental conditions, it is possible to observe whether those populations evolve in similar or different ways. Unsurprisingly, hybrid organisms produced through the ancestral gene insertion method tend to be less viable than the wild type parent strain. This is ongoing research, so definitive conclusions are not presented. How this research bears on the role of chance in evolution is hinted at, but not made explicit.

Gould's advocacy on behalf of the importance of contingency in the history of life is well known. In "Wonderful Life Revisited: Chance and Contingency in the Ediacaran-Cambrian Radiation," Douglas H. Erwin reconsiders Gould's arguments and conclusions from nearly three decades ago in light of empirical discoveries and conceptual advances since then. In general, Gould's specific claims have not fared well. Molecular clock and fossil evidence suggest that "the Cambrian explosion is a real and significant macroevolutionary event, but it is not the same thing as the origin and early diversification of the Metazoa, a process that played out over some 150 million years during the Cryogenian and Ediacaran" (p. 284). Additionally, experiments should lead us to be cautious in accepting Gould's claim that the history of life is radically contingent because whereas some experiments suggest that identical starting points can issue in markedly different outcomes, other experiments suggest just the opposite (pp. 290-291). A major theme throughout is that although we now understand much more about the actual history of life on earth than was known three decades ago, important questions for future research abound.

For any collection of essays by different authors one can ask whether the whole is truly greater than the sum of its parts. In the editors' introduction they write that, "Chance in Evolution knits together our knowledge of an incredibly wide array of information" (p. 10). "Knits together" is perhaps an exaggeration. Anyone interested in understanding the role of chance in evolutionary theorizing, and in the evolutionary process itself, will find much of interest in this book; they almost certainly will not come away with a unified, systematic understanding of this complex topic. Indeed, as noted above, a number of the essays barely mention the topic of chance at all, leaving the reader to guess what the topics they do discuss have to do with the ostensible focus of the volume. But the editors also declare that their book will be a resounding success if it helps to reinforce among its readers "the breadth of intellectual influences bearing on issues of chance in evolution." On this more modest criterion of success the book succeeds admirably.