Changing the Subject: Philosophy from Socrates to Adorno

Placeholder book cover

Raymond Geuss, Changing the Subject: Philosophy from Socrates to Adorno, Harvard University Press, 2017, 334 pp., $29.95, ISBN 9780674545724.

Reviewed by Frederick Neuhouser, Barnard College, Columbia University


This volume belongs to the genre of works that aim to tell us something about what Western philosophy is -- or, in this case perhaps, about what it was -- by recounting its history from ancient Greece to today (which here means, roughly, two decades after World War II). If this genre is familiar enough, the specific story Raymond Geuss tells is probably not the one you will have encountered in college survey courses or in more standard accounts of the history of philosophy. While the appearance of Geuss's book -- relatively slender compared to other such histories -- is not a reason to throw out the multiple volumes of Copleston on your bookshelf, it is an exceptionally engaging and welcome supplement to the best works in the genre to which it belongs.

One first notices the unusual character of Geuss's history in its table of contents: among the twelve philosophers treated in the book, four -- Lucretius, Montaigne, Lukács, and Adorno -- are usually regarded as marginal figures, if noticed at all, by Anglo-American philosophers. Meanwhile such giants as Aristotle, Descartes, and Kant are missing from Geuss's list and, as far as I could tell, never mentioned in the discussions of other philosophers. Geuss's history, in other words, does not aspire to completeness, at least not according to the standard understanding of that term. The remaining thinkers treated here are Socrates, Plato, Augustine, Hobbes, Hegel -- "the most original modern philosopher" (44) -- Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein. I was initially disappointed not to find Marx on this list, but his thought is well represented in the chapter on Lukács.

What, if anything, explains this unusual selection? My guess is that two factors were decisive. The first is the book's preference for practical over theoretical philosophy: questions about the good and other aspects of ethical, political, and social philosophy occupy center stage, and this is indicative of where Geuss takes philosophy's real significance to lie, namely, in reflection on, broadly speaking, the kinds of lives we ought to lead. This consideration might be sufficient to explain the exclusion of Descartes, but what about Aristotle and Kant? Here, it seems to me, a second consideration must be appealed to: Geuss has chosen to write only on philosophers he finds especially compelling and (because of this) about whom he has something enlightening to say. These principles of selection make his choice of philosophers idiosyncratic but not arbitrary. Indeed, one can be thankful for this species of idiosyncrasy (or modesty) since it enables Geuss to avoid the principal pitfall into which more comprehensive histories of Western philosophy -- Bertrand Russell's, for example -- tend to fall, namely, that of presuming to pronounce on the merits of philosophical positions one hasn't begun to understand.

Indeed, all of the book's chapters exhibit an unusually deep understanding of the thinkers they cover. Like a good teacher of philosophy, Geuss goes straight to what he takes to be the heart of the systems of thought he means to explain, without getting lost in scholarly details that only distract one from discovering why the twelve philosophers chosen deserve the careful -- I would say, loving -- attention they receive here. This is not to say that Geuss finds the personalities of these philosophers lovable -- many, he thinks, were unpleasant, even repulsive, human beings -- but, not confusing the man (there are no women here) with the philosophy, he presents us with deeply sympathetic and compelling accounts of the philosophical projects undertaken by each. Perhaps not surprisingly, the most exciting chapters for me were those on the philosophers I know the least -- Socrates, Lucretius, Augustine, and Montaigne -- but, because Geuss has a remarkable knack for putting even familiar thinkers in a new light that invites one to reconsider what is central to or important about their respective positions, I learned even from the chapters on thinkers whom I've spent many years teaching and writing about.

Although this is a highly subjective judgment, I found the chapter on Augustine the most enlightening of all, primarily because Geuss takes great care to explain the kind of project Augustine undertakes in his principal philosophical work, City of God, and how (and why) it differs so much from more familiar ways of doing philosophy. As Geuss explains with great lucidity, two features of Augustine's thought that make it foreign to more traditional philosophers are his insistence on the priority of love (of God) over reason and his views about the constitutive role of history -- that is, of particular historical events, such as the Fall and the Incarnation -- in giving shape to the problems of human life that are the object of philosophical reflection (102). The depth of this chapter is evident in the fact that after reading it I felt equipped not only to tackle Augustine once again, but also to re-read Kierkegaard, a philosopher whose importance (and perversity) Geuss recognizes (183, 317, 319), even though the "ascetic, self-hating" Dane receives no chapter of his own

As the title indicates, Geuss's principal thesis about the nature of Western philosophy is that it moves along (which is not to say "progresses"), not when philosophers bring us closer to answering the supposedly eternal questions of philosophy, nor when they think up increasingly clever moves in a well-established "game" of inquiry (4), but rather when they succeed in "changing the subject," or in finding a new way of posing questions that are somehow related to but no longer the same as those of their predecessors. (Geuss avoids the widely used term 'paradigm shift', but something akin to this is what he has in mind when he speaks of changing the subject.) According to this thesis, what is distinctive about philosophy "is that it generally avoids giving a direct answer to a question. Rather it changes the question, and what is . . . most enlightening is to look carefully at why and how the question changes" (1). This claim is closely related to Geuss's distancing himself from the thought that "there is anything like a single transhistorical nature or essence of 'philosophy'"; there are, instead, "only related historical practices" (8).

Sometimes Geuss characterizes changing the subject in a way that suggests that the changes in question might also constitute a form of progress similar to the sort that Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit claims to exemplify. In one place, for example, changing the subject is described as "redefining the situation by reference to a wider situation in which it is embedded" (4). This description of the new as resulting from a kind of meta-reflection on what preceded it can encourage the thought that the history of philosophy is progressive -- ever more encompassing -- insofar as it proceeds by taking account of the conditions that made earlier philosophies possible or intelligible. In fact, however, the changes depicted by Geuss are seldom, if ever, of a type that could be described as reflections on the wider context within which earlier systems of thought operated. Augustine, for example, innovates in philosophy not by pointing to a wider context within which the thought of Socrates or Plato or Lucretius operated but rather by, in a literal and straightforward sense, changing the questions that occupied them -- for example, by taking love rather than reason to hold the key to understanding the meaning of human existence, and to thinking about the kinds of lives we ought to lead (286). This more modest construal of Geuss's project is consistent with his admission that "it is by no means clear that changing the situation through reconfiguration represents either moral or cognitive progress" (7). It also explains why his account of the history is not a narrative in any robust sense; there is no overarching teleology to the succession of positions he relates, and later configurations of thought appear to follow on, but not from, those that precede them.

One question I asked myself as I was reading this book is whether Geuss thinks that Western philosophy has come to an end. The book's twelve chapters contain no explicit avowal of an end-of-philosophy thesis -- that would be too predictive for Geuss's taste -- but two aspects of his discussions suggested to me throughout that some version of this idea might be at work here. The first is that the book ends with Adorno -- whose name (not accidentally, I presume) is the most prominent word on the book's cover -- and it is natural to take his well-known account of the interdependence of myth and reason in Dialectic of Enlightenment as heralding the end of Western philosophy, at least as traditionally conceived. If Adorno marks the end of Geuss's story, then perhaps that story ends with the end of philosophy. (Although, it should be noted, the end of philosophy is proclaimed in some form by all six of the philosophers in the book's final half, suggesting that philosophy might be more robust than its own practitioners imagine.) This aspect of Geuss's book could be taken to suggest that there is something intrinsically self-undermining in the very kind of rational inquiry undertaken by Western philosophy that guarantees, when it is carried out with perfect consistency, its own demise. Something like this was maintained by Nietzsche, for example, who believed that the Christian over-valuation of truth, when adopted by philosophers, would undermine the very commitments to "pure" reason that made enterprises such as metaphysics or rationally founded ethics intelligible in the first place.

Second, there is a dim, apocalyptic mood, reminiscent of Weber, that hangs over the entire book, expressing itself in scattered references to impending "catastrophe" and "calamity," especially in the form of ecological collapse (e.g., 45, 249, 292, 301), as well as to the spirit-killing forms of totalizing bureaucratization that Geuss, echoing Adorno, refers to simply as "California" (293). ('Southern California' seems to me the more appropriate term, but this is a mere quibble.) There is even some suggestion, perhaps taken over from Heidegger, that Western philosophy itself -- more precisely, the ways in which it was shaped by Socrates's mode of formulating its concerns and mode of inquiry -- is to blame for this development: "perhaps that catastrophe is precisely Western philosophy, although the full force of that calamity did not hit Plato [or other philosophers] so much as the whole population of Europe during the subsequent 2,000 years or so" (45).

The most natural way of construing this version of the end-of-philosophy thesis is not to think of Western philosophy as internally, or rationally, self-undermining, in the sense that what makes it no longer possible is a result of consistently enacting the very commitment to the rational questioning that is constitutive of it. We could rather think of Western philosophy as having championed a distorted conception of the power and autonomy of reason that has fostered a view of the relation between human beings and the rest of nature that turns the latter into a mere instrument for human purposes. This, in turn, has produced an ecological crisis of such proportions that the preconditions, not merely of philosophy, but perhaps of life itself, are now in danger of final destruction. Geuss alludes to this possibility in his conclusion but, consistently with the book's modest tone, treats it as merely one possibility among others. For if, as he at one point suggests, philosophy sometimes arises as a response to "apparently irreconcilable  . . .  conflict, severe suffering, real loss, [and] experienced deprivation or weakness" (298), then our impending ecological crisis might well provide a new impetus for philosophy's renewal. Or perhaps, since philosophy presupposes a "certain minimum of optimism" sufficient to make its sort of thinking seem worthwhile (299), it might in conditions of ecological devastation simply meet its ultimate demise.

Finally, it seems worth asking, What, if anything, makes (or has made) Western philosophy valuable? Characteristically, no direct answer is given. This question becomes all the more pressing when one notes that each chapter -- except perhaps the final one, on Adorno -- ends with what appears to be a decisive critique of its philosopher's project. Perhaps, however, an indirect answer can be found by attending to an unmistakable feature of Geuss's tracing the course (and possible demise) of Western philosophy. There are books that assert the catastrophic fate of Western philosophy that have the effect of turning its readers away from it for once and for all, extinguishing in them any desire to engage positively with the ideas of the (mostly) dead white males who created and sustained that tradition. Geuss's book has precisely the opposite effect. His lively and witty but still rigorous accounts of the undertakings of some of Western philosophy's main protagonists will generate in most of its readers only a thirst for more. As I have discovered, this book makes an excellent gift for bright and curious non-philosophers who want to understand what it is that philosophers do (or have done). It is also a perfect remedy for harried professional philosophers -- there are enough of us -- who, swallowed up in the Betrieb of academia, sometimes forget why they fell in love with philosophy in the first place.