Character and Causation: Hume's Philosophy of Action

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Constantine Sandis, Character and Causation: Hume's Philosophy of Action, Routledge, 2019, 148pp., $155.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138283787.

Reviewed by Liz Goodnick, Metropolitan State University of Denver


While Hume does not have an explicit "philosophy of action," Constantine Sandis's monograph seeks to bring together various aspects of Hume's work (including causation, free will, personal identity, motivation, and explanation in history, among others) to develop such a theory. The book is composed of seven chapters, each somewhat independent essays, which attempt to bring these disparate elements of Hume's philosophy together to build a coherent picture of Hume's view on human action. Sandis claims that his discussion of Hume's understanding of causation, freedom, agency, etc. "form part of a systematic treatment of how and why we act (and, by implication, reason) as we do" (120). While he notes that Hume was not concerned with developing a philosophy of action, per se, he was interested in human action insofar as it connects to a general understanding of human nature and morality.

In this review, I will argue that Sandis delivers on his goal of showing that Hume is not as paradigmatically Humean as the label may suggest. However, perhaps because of the fragmented nature of Hume's treatment of typical questions in philosophy of action, Sandis does not deliver on providing a systematic Humean theory of human action. Instead, he provides separate but related arguments concluding that Hume holds various theses concerning human action and situates these theses within contemporary debates.

Sandis's treatment of Hume's philosophy of action begins in the second half of the book. In Chapter 5, Sandis argues that Hume is volitionist (of sorts -- Hume's view amounts to the thesis that willed actions have different causes from bodily movements), but claims that this doesn't play a significant role in Hume's philosophy. Moreover, he notes, this doesn't affect Hume's compatibilism about freedom and necessity. Sandis goes on in Chapter 6 to argue that Hume is actually a weak anti-Humean regarding motivation (in the contemporary sense) insofar as certain moral beliefs can motivate one to act without a corresponding desire. Sandis also argues in Chapter 6 that Hume is more of an error-theorist about motivating reasons, denies the contemporary presupposition that the reasons for which we act are identical to the things that motivate us to act, and endorses the claim that actions can be caused by non-psychological facts (anti-psychologism).

In Chapter 7, Sandis suggests that Hume avoids Davidson's problem of deviant causal chains insofar as, for Hume, whichever motive best fits the agent's character is the best explanation of the agent's action. Thus, Hume's answer to the question of which act is the agent's own is whichever flows from their character. This connects to earlier chapters on identity and character (4 and 5) and freedom (3) insofar as Hume's conception of character must be robust enough to allow for both agency and moral responsibility (though Sandis notes that Hume faces problems of holding an agent accountable for an act that is out of character).

Sandis rounds out the book with an unusual discussion of Hume's History of England, where he brings in Bertolt Brecht's theory of epic theatre and R.G. Collingwood's account of historical understanding as re-enactment to shed light on Hume's claim that historians are well-suited to understand the actions and motives of people in the past. Sandis claims that historians have enough interest to exhibit sympathy and to re-enact the thought processes of past people, but enough emotional detachment to be sufficiently objective observers of them. As a result, historians can truly comprehend past individuals' actions and motives.

The various theses that Sandis argues Hume holds are not connected by any underlying theory of human action. They are tied together, I suppose, by a methodology -- Hume is an empiricist and therefore, as Sandis points out, all of Hume's theories about human action are based on observation (of others and of himself). But this would be true of literally any of Hume's theses, so it doesn't make for a coherent theory of human action. Instead, what really ties them together, at least in Sandis's mind, is that they are all based on what he calls Hume's "soft conceptual revisionism." Like Hume's empiricism, Hume's soft revisionism is a general feature of Hume's philosophy, according to Sandis, so while it may connect various theses, it is not itself a theory of human action. Sandis lays out this reading of Hume in the Prologue and applies it in his interpretation of Hume on belief in Chapter 1, causation in Chapter 2, necessity in Chapter 3, personal identity in Chapter 4, and character in Chapter 5.

According to Sandis, Hume's soft revisionism is based in his commitment to the Copy Principle -- the claim that there can be no idea without a corresponding impression. When Hume analyzes contentious metaphysical concepts like cause, power, self, etc., his strategy is to look for the impression (or impressions, if the idea is complex) from which the idea was copied. If he cannot find any impression, Hume claims that the concept is empty (and that the word is meaningless). However, for many concepts, like causation, necessity, etc., Hume does not conclude that these are not based on any impression; instead, the impressions from which our ideas are copied are somewhat unexpected. Thus, Sandis claims, Hume revises the concept to be more in line with our actual impressions -- altering the meaning of these concepts, but without becoming a crude reductionist nor a sceptical realist.

This is probably most clear in the case of necessary connection, an important component idea in our complex idea of causation. Hume notes that when we say, for example, that bread nourishes, we don't simply mean that bread and nourishment have been constantly conjoined in our experience -- additionally, we think that there is some necessary connection between the two. However, when Hume looks for the impression of necessary connection, he cannot find it in the objects (in bread itself, or even in the various impressions of the conjunction of bread and nourishment). Instead, he claims, after many instances of eating bread, there is a strong connection between the idea of bread and the idea of nourishment. When we see some bread (or even think of it), we cannot help but believe that it will nourish us (we automatically acquire the idea of nourishment). We feel a connection between these two ideas, and this is the impression that we copy to get our idea of necessary connection. This is surprising because the connection is not between objects in the world, but between ideas in our mind. Hume thus revises the concept of necessary connection (and therefore causation) to be more in line with our impressions: "'Tis the constant conjunction of objects, along with the determination of the mind, which constitutes a physical necessity" (T /171, p. 46 in Sandis).

Sandis argues that Hume threads the needle between a reductivist understanding of causation -- that our concept 'cause' contains nothing more than constant conjunction -- and the sceptical realism the "new Hume" scholars purport -- that Hume believes that there are necessary connections between the causes and effects, although we can't know for certain that they exist. Instead, Sandis argues, Hume reconceives of causation as something more than mere constant conjunction but fails to commit to the metaphysical baggage of the sceptical realist. There are necessary connections, but they are between ideas, in our mind, and it is this that Hume incorporates into our notion of causation.

In subsequent chapters, Sandis spells out how Hume's "soft revisionism" is present in his discussions of human freedom, personal identity, and character. He then uses these revised concepts in his interpretation of Hume's theses regarding human action. For example, Hume can say that human actions are necessitated while still allowing for free will in a compatibilist sense, since necessity in human action is just constant conjunction and human expectation (the feeling that gives rise to necessity).

Sandis uses his soft revisionist interpretation to tie together, at least methodologically, Hume's various theses concerning human action. However, his soft revisionist reading is not particularly original (aside from its appellation). In his famous 1991 article, "The New Hume," Kenneth Winkler similarly argues against a causal realist interpretation of Hume, but without interpreting Hume through a positivist lens. Instead, he interprets Hume, as Sandis does, as a skeptic: "I will argue that Hume refrains from affirming that there is something in virtue of which the world is regular in the way it is. This is not to deny that there is such a thing, but merely not to believe in it" (p. 543).[1]

Sandis's interpretation of Hume goes beyond this, though, insofar as he argues that Hume revises the notion of necessity to be more in line with our impressions. Although not as explicit, we can also find this idea in Winkler's essay: "Both miss the fact that Hume admits we have an idea of necessary connection, and that it comes to more than constant conjunction (even if it arises out of our experience of such conjunction)" (p. 573).[2] Since the "New Hume debate," many scholars have interpreted Hume as threading this needle between the positivist and the realist, and though Sandis does engage with some of these scholars, notably, Peter Kail, I would argue that he does not add very much to the debate.

Where I do think Sandis adds to the existing literature, however, is in his main argument of Chapter 6 for the claim that Hume is actually a weak anti-Humean regarding motivation (in the contemporary sense) insofar as certain moral beliefs can motivate alone. A so-called "Humean" theory of motivation claims that humans are motivated by reasons for acting that are constituted by our desires and beliefs, and, perhaps more importantly, that we cannot be motivated by beliefs alone. Many commentators argue (or assume) that Hume is a Humean about motivation (as the label suggests), especially in light of Hume's claim that reason cannot motivate us and is "perfectly inert" (T Sandis, however, disagrees.

He first notes that most of Hume's statements on the matter amount to the claim that reason cannot motivate alone. Sandis also cleverly notes that, as opposed to what many scholars assume, for Hume, reason and belief are not synonymous. Beliefs, for Hume, are sentiments (though they are capable of being true or false) and have a similar influence on the passions as impressions; while reason is a faculty that produces beliefs. Thus, he claims, it is not at all clear that the fact that reason alone cannot motivate means that beliefs alone cannot motivate. At most, it means that "beliefs derived from reason alone cannot motivate alone" (97). But this leaves plenty of other beliefs -- those not derived from reason alone -- as fair game. Sandis continues to argue that moral beliefs can fulfil this role insofar as they are not conclusions of reason alone.

Overall, Sandis's book provides a nice introduction to Hume's philosophy of action. While his interpretation on more commonly studied parts of Hume's philosophy (causation, necessity, free will, etc.) is not particularly cutting edge (which a survey of the bibliography and more importantly what is most frequently cited and discussed in the text reveals), he does use it to explore a neglected area of Hume scholarship. Unfortunately, the book may not be as useful to Hume scholars who do not have a background in action theory, as a solid background in that discipline is assumed.

Finally, citations to Hume's works (especially the Treatise) are not consistent, which may cause trouble for Hume scholars (especially younger scholars who have been educated with the new scholarly standard -- texts prepared for the Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume). The Prologue cites only the book, part, section, and paragraph; Chapters 2 and 3 sometimes cite only the Selby-Bigge page numbers (but sometimes cites the book, part, section, and paragraph as well); and Chapters 1, 4, 5, 6, and 7 almost always cites both (though occasionally only the book, part, section, and paragraph). Given that the standard editions contain the Selby-Bigge page numbers, it will not be impossible for scholars to look up what is cited. However, the inconsistency serves as a mark of sloppiness on the part of the author and perhaps the editor as well.

[1] Kenneth Winkler, "The New Hume", The Philosophical Review, Vol. 100, No. 4 (Oct., 1991), pp. 541-579

[2] Ibid.