Character and Environment: A Virtue-Oriented Approach to Environmental Ethics

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Ronald L. Sandler, Character and Environment: A Virtue-Oriented Approach to Environmental Ethics, Columbia University Press, 2007, 201pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231141062.

Reviewed by Peter Wenz, University of Illinois, Springfield


Since its inception in the 1970s, the academic discipline of environmental ethics has been dominated by several concerns.  Should proper actions and attitudes regarding the environment be anthropocentric (human-centered) or nonanthropocentric (including more than human beings); should the subjects of concern be only individuals or should they include such holistic entities as species and ecosystems; should individuals of concern include all living beings, only those capable of sentience, or only those capable of some level, not necessarily the human level, of self-awareness?  Ronald Sandler and others working in the field of environmental virtue ethics add another distinction that cuts across all of these.  Should we try to discern proper courses of action by developing and employing rules or principles of proper conduct, or should we identify and develop character traits of virtuous persons and then act in specific situations as the appropriate virtues suggest?  In Character and Environment, Sandler makes a lucid and powerful case for the virtue approach in general and for its particular application to environmental ethics.  The book contains many valuable analyses of philosophical controversies with judicious suggestions for resolution.  Here, with little criticism, I present an outline of the case he makes for virtue ethics and for virtue environmental ethics, disagreeing with him only about two applications of his views.

Two major challenges for virtue ethics are identifying the virtues and gaining action guidance from them in specific situations.  The issue of identification is beset by problems of cultural relativity.  In some societies self flagellation is a virtue; in others fostering human welfare without much prospect of material reward is a virtue; in still others the most virtuous people become wealthy and powerful, are generous to friends, and are merciless toward enemies.  How can we justify one set of virtues against competing accounts?  Appeal to the character traits of virtuous people cannot be decisive because cultural relativity applies to the identification of such people as virtuous.

Sandler overcomes this difficulty with a modified eudaimonistic-naturalistic approach.  Eudaimonism calls for actions and dispositions oriented toward the teleological goal of flourishing.  From the naturalistic perspective, character traits are virtues for social animals to the extent that they foster flourishing, which includes, at a minimum, individual survival, continuation of the species, relative freedom from pain, the ability to experience species-specific enjoyment, and the continuation of the social group.  This is "natural goodness" which, Sandler claims, is necessary but not sufficient for human virtues.  Human beings require more because humans are capable of autonomy, meaning in their lives, the accumulation of knowledge, and respect for noneudaimonistic goods or values (goods or values that do not contribute to human flourishing, such as the preservation of a remote species unrelated to human welfare).

According to Sandler, the best human life requires virtues oriented toward the realization of this irreducibly pluralistic set of goods.  Thus, for example, honesty and compassion are character traits people should develop (they are virtues) because, it is thought, they "contribute to the good functioning of a person's social group and the formation of relationships that provide both enjoyment and assistance when needed.  Temperance is thought to contribute to a person's physical and psychological well-being" (p. 22).  Other virtues are justified by similar reasoning.

There is no universal ordering of the virtues according to which acting under the guidance of certain virtues always trumps acting under the guidance of certain other virtues.  What is more, because human flourishing takes place in social groups, some element of cultural relativism remains.  Virtues and behaviors conducive to flourishing in one cultural context may not do so elsewhere.  There is even an element of individual relativism.  For example, people cannot always do what the most virtuous person in that culture would do in a given situation because the most virtuous person may be able to act in ways that would cause unacceptable psychological harm to would-be imitators.  Yet, in spite of these forms of relativism, a kind of objectivity pervades virtue ethics to the extent that general eudaimonistic and noneudaimonistic goals are set through reflection on the nature of and requirements for human flourishing, with additional consideration of nonhuman values.  Although any given account of these goals can be contested, the discussion can be grounded, as Sandler's is, in reasoning based on facts and some rarely-contested values.

A recurring objection to virtue ethics is its inability to supply sufficient action guidance.  Sandler approaches this problem in part by noting that competing approaches to ethics do no better.  Deontological theories are beset by conflicting duties; act-utilitarian theories find that human beings cannot perform the calculations needed to identify right actions; and rule-consequentialist theories reduce to consequentialism when rules conflict.  Thus, "no ethical theory can eliminate the need for good situational judgment, regardless of how 'mechanical' or 'codifiable' its rules and principles" (p. 99).

Sandler's other response to the action-guidance problem is that virtue ethics allows the introduction of v-rules, which specify how to act in accordance with particular virtues.  "For example, because a disposition to help alleviate the suffering of other people when there is little cost to oneself is partly constitutive of compassion, there is a v-rule: 'help alleviate the suffering of other people when there is little cost to oneself'" (p. 98).  Such rules can be formulated and taught just as deontological rules can.  The major difference is that v-rules, unlike deontological rules, receive their ultimate justification as manifestations of virtues.  Sandler's version of virtue ethics is thus two-tiered.  Reflection on goals yields a set of virtues.  The virtues, not the ultimate goals, are consulted when action is needed, with v-rules assisting the connection between the virtues and the actions they inspire.

Sandler begins applying virtue ethics to environmental matters by defining "environmental virtues" as virtues that are responsive to environmental entities, justified by environmental considerations, and/or supportive of environmental goods or values.  Virtues of environmental activism, for example, promote environmental goods and values because they aid "success in social and political domains in securing environmental goods…"  Among these virtues are such character traits as "commitment, astuteness, discipline, attentiveness, discernment, fortitude, creativity, courage, self-control, cooperativeness, patience, solidarity, perseverance, and optimism…" (p. 49).  Virtues of communion with nature, which include wonder, are responsive to environmental entities.  Wonder provides the eudaimonistic benefits of exhilaration, joy, and satisfaction.  Additional environmental virtues are "dispositions conducive to peace and opposed to violent conflict …  since warfare and violence generally compromise the availability of environmental goods" (p. 54).  Also, because consumerism is environmentally destructive, dispositions to reduce reliance on an increasing flow of material goods are virtues, whereas greed, intemperance, profligacy, and envy, which promote increased consumption of material goods, are vices.

Sandler's environmental virtue ethics is not anthropocentric.  Sandler maintains that some environmental virtues are responsive to or aimed at the welfare of nonhuman entities without reference to human flourishing.  Endorsing the main arguments for biocentric egalitarianism, he concludes that all living individuals have a good of their own and inherent worth, but thinks that the possibilities of pain and pleasure give sentient beings a stronger claim to our attention.  Addressing counter-intuitive results of treating all sentient beings equally, Sandler appeals to the trade-offs and good judgment that are inherent in his pluralistic approach to ethics.  For example, we cannot display toward wild animals all the compassion that we display toward fellow human beings or domestic pets (protect them from predators and cure their illnesses) because this is incompatible with our own flourishing; "it is not sensitive to our form of life" (p. 75).  People looking for a deep, unifying analysis may be disappointed here, but those who think that the best ethical analyses organize and bring logical rigor to common sense will be pleased.

At one point in this discussion, however, Sandler seems, perhaps unwittingly, to diverge from common-sense ideas because he conflates nonanthropocentrism with egalitarianism.  Defending environmental virtue ethics against charges of anthropocentrism, Sandler denies that "humans are afforded a special, privileged place within nature (or outside of nature)" (p. 115).  Can this be right?  I think I can consistently be nonanthropocentric, adopting vegetarianism, for example, out of respect and concern for nonhuman animals, without believing that human and nonhuman animals are of equal value.  Consider one of those horrid runaway-train examples.  If the runaway train were heading toward an unsuspecting, innocent child, I would not hesitate to pull the switch to send it toward several equally unsuspecting, innocent cows.  I can thus be speciesist (favoring human beings in a nonegalitarian way) without being anthropocentric (denying moral standing or inherent worth to nonhuman animals).  I think my intuition here is widespread and insensitive to the details of particular situations, thus justifying the speciesist v-rule: when an event or entity (hurricane, volcano, lion, flood, sinking ship, runaway train, etc.) threatens the lives of both an innocent person and innocent nonhuman animals, and I can save either the person or the animals, but not both, I should save the person. Elsewhere in his book, especially in the section "Differential Compassion" (pp. 74-76), Sandler is more nuanced.  But he seems not to realize that such nuance is inescapably speciesist rather than egalitarian.

Another issue regarding nonanthropocentrism concerns the status of such holistic entities as species and ecosystems.  Sandler argues cogently, I think, that such entities are not sufficiently integrated as single beings to have a good of their own.  They are not direct subjects of moral concern.  Sandler thus sides with individualism over holism in environmental ethics.  Still, he endorses virtues appropriate to a land ethic, such as "love, wonder, attunement, care, temperance, ecological sensitivity, receptivity, and appreciation" (p. 83) for nature, as these promote the flourishing of people and other living individuals.

Sandler concludes the book by illustrating virtue-ethical reasoning through a consideration of the genetic engineering of crops.  Many GM crops are designed to reduce the use of herbicides and pesticides, so they would appear to be environmentally beneficial.  However, Sandler notes, there are dangers of unintended consequences, such as the evolution, spurred by GM crops, of super-weeds and super-pests that will impair agriculture, destabilize ecosystems, and diminish human flourishing.  Accordingly, Sandler evaluates GM crops against a v-rule that he calls the external goods criterion: "a particular technology should only be supported if there are reasons to believe that it will not disrupt the integrity of natural and agricultural ecosystems we depend upon…" (p. 126).

Viewed in the context of current agricultural practice, Sandler finds that most GM crops are integrated within, and inextricable from, the kind of unsustainable, mechanized, monocultural, chemically-oriented, industrial agriculture that harms soils, depletes water supplies, deprives people in poor countries of their livelihoods, and enriches corporations.  The external goods criterion rules out support for such GM crops.  However, Sandler finds that one GM crop, golden rice (rice genetically engineered to contain the vitamin A that many people in poor countries need) is an exception to this rule.  It was developed by a non-profit organization and will be distributed free to poor farmers.  It can be crossbred with local varieties of rice so it does not displace traditional, sustainable agricultural practices.  Finally, it will reduce the number of people, especially children, who go blind for lack of vitamin A.  In short, it does not fall afoul of the external goods criterion.

But what about other virtues and vices?  Sandler rejects the idea that all GM crops, including golden rice, are disrespectful of nature because, if they meet the external goods criterion, they are not harming ecosystems and are therefore no worse than traditional crops, whose development and use are not considered disrespectful of nature.  Sandler also rejects the claim that all GM crops, including golden rice, manifest the vice of hubris, which in this context means people arrogating to themselves too much power over nature.  He writes, "There is nothing about GM crops that precludes them from being part of, for example, crop diversity or integrated pest management techniques in agriculture" (p. 136), sustainable practices that accept environmental limits.

I disagree with Sandler here.  I think all GM crops are inextricably bound to the kind of hubris that harms people and nature as people suppose, incorrectly, that they are wise enough to control nature in ever more detailed ways, in this case, down to the genome.  In addition, contrary to Sandler, I think golden rice supports monocultural agriculture.  First, it allows people to get more of what they need nutritionally from a single crop, which also happens to be a cash crop often grown in monocultures as part of industrial agriculture.  Second, Vandana Shiva reports that golden rice serves in India as a substitute for what was, before the Green Revolution, a freely available wild plant, bathua, that contains vitamin A.  Golden rice supports the polluting, wealth-concentrating, water-depleting excesses of the Green Revolution by (possibly) removing one of its most odious consequences, childhood blindness.  Without denying that golden rice was developed with good intentions, it does seem to play a significant role in industrial agriculture, and Sandler argues convincingly that such agriculture does not satisfy the demands of environmental virtue ethics.

In sum, Character and Environment is an excellent addition to the literature in virtue ethics and in environmental ethics.  It makes a convincing case for a distinctive moral epistemology that grounds a virtue-oriented framework of ethical thinking which facilitates reasoned debate on many specific issues.