Character as Moral Fiction

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Mark Alfano, Character as Moral Fiction, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 226pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107026728.

Reviewed by Neera K. Badhwar, University of Oklahoma/George Mason University


Mark Alfano's book adds to the growing literature on empirical challenges to Aristotelian notions of virtue and other character traits. In its most recent avatar, this literature argues that our innate cognitive biases and other flaws make the central moral and intellectual Aristotelian virtues, as usually understood, impossible for the vast majority.[1] Alfano makes this argument with the help of a vast number of well-replicated psychological experiments, producing a work that is smart, original, and entertaining. On the positive side, Alfano argues that most people can be brought to behave in accordance with (as opposed to from) the virtues with the proper use of "moral technology" (MT). MT bridges the gap between normative virtue ethics and virtue epistemology, on the one hand, and moral psychology on the other. Part I of the book is devoted to showing that the central moral virtues are beyond the capacity of most people, Part II to showing the same of virtue epistemology's central intellectual virtues, and Part III to a fascinating discussion of "social distance" and three historical models of social distance. I will focus on Parts I and II.

Part I

Alfano starts by identifying what he calls, following Imre Lakatos, the "hard core" of virtue ethics (34). He offers a list of nine features that constitute its hard core, of which I note here only the ones that he regards as both central to, and problematic for, virtue ethics: virtue is temporally stable, cross-situationally consistent, has explanatory power, has predictive power (weak for "low-fidelity" virtues like kindness, near-certain for "high-fidelity" virtues like justice), and is egalitarian ("Almost anyone can reliably act in accordance with virtue" (34)).

Alfano's target is the conjunction of these features. Before going further, a few remarks are in order about some of them. Alfano's formulations of stability and consistency here entail that someone who possesses a virtue will possess it permanently (stability) and globally, that is, in every virtue-relevant situation (consistency). The same understanding of consistency appears in his explanation of why people tend to believe in cross-situational traits (53-61; 79). But in several places Alfano argues that consistency doesn't entail that virtue is global, and stability doesn't entail that it is permanent (10, 27). Indeed, even the "fully virtuous person," he says, "is disposed to do the appropriate thing [only] in a wide range of circumstances" (3). How, then, should we interpret the consistency claim Alfano disputes? It's easy to show that most people are not globally virtuous -- we hardly need experiments for that. And the experiments discussed cannot show that no one can be globally virtuous, since there are always some subjects who act rightly for the right reason.[2] I will therefore take Alfano's thesis to be the more interesting and significant one that experiments show that most people cannot be virtuous in a wide range of circumstances.

Alfano's formulation of the egalitarianism requirement for an empirically adequate virtue ethics also presents a problem. First, virtue ethics requires that we act from virtue, so even if most people were capable of acting according to virtue, so long as they weren't capable of acting from virtue, virtue ethics would need to be revised. Second, Alfano has already stated that most people can be brought to behave according to virtue with the proper use of moral technology, so the egalitarian condition as currently stated can be met. Third, most of Alfano's critique of virtue ethics is couched in terms of people's failure to act from virtue, even when they act according to virtue. I will therefore take Alfano's target to be the claim that the vast majority can act from enduring virtues, and that their virtues (or other traits) can explain and (strongly or weakly) predict their behavior in a wide range of circumstances.

Assuming that Alfano's interpretations of the experiments he discusses are accurate, the question is: how well do they support his arguments? Alfano argues that the factors that explain most behavior are bad reasons and situational non-reasons (he mentions "non-moral individual differences," but dismisses them (35).) It seems that in many morally significant situations, most of us act for reasons we are unaware of -- or for no reason at all. We often do the right thing for the wrong reason, or the wrong thing because features of our situation trigger automatic cognitive processes we are unaware of and cannot control. Experiments on helpful behavior show, Alfano argues, that most people lack the virtues that are supposed to result in helping behavior: kindness, compassion, generosity, etc. Ambient smells and noises, and good or bad moods, can make all the difference to whether most people will help a needy stranger. For example, people are significantly more likely to help another in the vicinity of a bakery, where they can smell freshly baked bread, than in a 'neutral' environment. A good mood makes people far more helpful than a neutral or sad or depressed mood (46-50). Happiness, embarrassment, and guilt also make people more likely to notice and respond to another's need (46). Conversely, a loud (85 dB) lawnmower makes people significantly less likely to help another.

Alfano (and other situationists) argue that these facts are problematic because ambient smells and noises, and positive or negative psychological states, are morally irrelevant, yet massively influential on what we attend to, and how and what we decide, feel, and do (44). They are morally irrelevant because they do not provide moral reasons for acting. Indeed, unlike temptations or bad reasons, Alfano argues, these factors give no reason at all, and thus have no place in virtue ethicists' moral psychology (43-44). In addition, the influence of these factors is hidden from us, as shown by the fact that when people are asked why they helped, they don't cite the pleasant smell of baked bread, or their good mood, or their guilt or embarrassment. This shows that a lot of the time we are not in rational control of our actions, or the springs of our actions.

Alfano's conclusion assumes, however, that if these environmental or psychological factors play a causal role in the production of our actions, virtue cannot also be playing a necessary role. And this assumption is unjustified. The evidence is compatible with the conclusion that the environmental or psychological factors in question merely make it easier to act on the standing reasons most of us have to help others when helping them is not a heavy burden or an obstacle to our own legitimate ends. Alfano notes that, according to many psychologists, these factors lead people to help because they enable them to notice occasions for helping and open them to new experiences (44-50). But if so, then they are among the conditions that form the causal background of our perceptions and actions, along with well-functioning senses, and the ability for means-end reasoning. The fact that we did not know how great and pervasive is their effect on our cognition before psychologists provided us with the evidence does not change this fact.

Nor should it be cause for concern if these factors lead to more helping behavior because they supply us with an additional motivation to help. Except in the case of misanthropes, happy feelings make people more prone to want others to be happy too, and this is reason enough to help them when doing so is appropriate. There would be cause for concern only if, for most people, happy feelings (or guilt or embarrassment or pleasant smells or . . . ) were a sine qua non for helping others. But the experiments do not show this, and anyone who's grown up in a normal family in a normal neighborhood knows this to be false.

The fact that a noisy lawnmower or depressed mood can prevent people from helping others also doesn't show that most people lack kindness in a wide range of circumstances. Noisy lawnmowers would also prevent most of us from doing our work well, and depressed moods would prevent us from doing what is best for ourselves. But no one would say that this shows that most people can't work well, period, or can't serve their own interests, period. Alfano is right that virtue requires, among other things, awareness of the morally relevant features of our environment (76). It doesn't follow, however, that it requires us to be on a constant lookout for people to help -- this is a task for Superman. We are physical and psychological beings who need certain environmental, physiological, and psychological conditions to obtain in order to function well.

Alfano's argument that the environmental and mood studies show that most people have no genuine kindness rests on another unjustified assumption, viz., that genuinely kind people would help every person with a legitimate need whenever it wasn't too costly to do so (36). But this assumption ignores the fact that the policy of doing so would be immensely costly. In this age of instant communication, we don't need to be out on the street to encounter legitimate need. We encounter it at our desks, on the radio, on TV, and on the phone. If we responded to each worthy appeal for help, we'd have no time left for our own projects.

The bystander experiments strongly support the commonsense belief that most people do have some kindness -- even as they reveal some widespread human weaknesses. On the one hand, the vast majority of people help strangers when there is no one else around, the situation is serious, and helping is not too risky for them. On the other hand, when there areothers around and the situation is ambiguous, the chances of anyone helping a person in distress go down in proportion to the number of people at the scene. This counterintuitive result is sometimes due to innocent mistakes in reasoning, such as thinking that others will help ("diffusion of responsibility"), or thinking that no one needs help because no one else seems concerned ("pluralistic ignorance"), in each case failing to realize that others are doing nothing because they too are thinking the very same thing. Sometimes, however, the cause of inaction is a character flaw, as when no one acts because he is more afraid of making a fool of himself ("evaluation apprehension"), should the person who seems to be in distress not really be in distress, than about helping this person should he really need help. These experiments show that most human beings' kindness, compassion, and so on are not global, but not, contra Alfano, that most people don't or can't have them in a wide range of circumstances. On p. 32 Alfano acknowledges that it is hard to use experiments to show that most people cannot have low-fidelity virtues like kindness, generosity, and so on, because possessing these virtues is compatible with not behaving accordingly in every virtue-relevant situation. But he forgets this when he starts discussing the experiments.

Experiments for testing high-fidelity virtues like honesty and justice also show only that most people's honesty or justice is neither global nor very deep in many contexts, not that they cannot be honest or just in a wide range of contexts. In experiments with students at Harvard and elsewhwere, Dan Ariely found that the majority of students cheat when given the chance -- but only a little, even when there is no chance of their getting caught (39). Yet in one experiment, when students are asked to write down all the Ten Commandments they can remember before taking the test, no one cheats. In the famous Milgram experiment, when the experimenter is next to the subject and the learner is out of sight, 65% of subjects obey the experimenter and shock the learner (ostensibly) to death. But when the experimenter is absent and the learner is next to the subject, obedience plummets. And when the experimenter himself assumes the role of learner, every single person stops as soon as he tells them to stop. Alfano follows Milgram in arguing that status and proximity or distance play a huge role in people's actions. But Milgram regards two other factors as even more crucial in explaining obedience: people's tendency to see themselves as mere instruments of the authority figure, instead of as responsible agents, and their tendency to care more about not being blamed than about doing the just thing. These factors are significant because, along with deference for status, and unlike distance and proximity, habituation plays a huge role in turning these natural tendencies into negative character traits. So it is possible that with better habituation these tendencies could be weakened, and the contrary tendencies strengthened, in most people.

Alfano concludes Part I with a discussion of what he calls "factitious moral virtue". This is one of the most original and most interesting parts of the book, in my view. Alfano argues that publicly labelling S as honest or generous induces S to think of himself as honest or generous, and to believe that others expect him to behave honestly or generously. "Trait attributions of the right sort function as self-fulfilling prophecies" (83), because people want to live up to their own self-conception as well as the expectations of others. The right sort of public trait attributions are those that are plausible and made of a target who has a correct conception of the virtue in question. Calling a dishonest politician honest is more likely to encourage his dishonesty than to make him honest, because he might think that you are too naïve to see through his chicanery. Someone who behaves honestly only because he thinks that honesty is the best policy will not start loving honesty for its own sake by being labeled honest. Virtue-labelling is also most successful when done right after a person has acted in accordance with the virtue.

Alfano ably defends virtue-labelling against the charge that it is epistemically impermissible, arguing that, just as the beliefs involved in placebo effects and self-fulfilling prophecies violate the evidence norm for beliefs ex ante, but satisfy it ex post, so do beliefs involved in the right sort of virtue-labelling. These beliefs turn out to be true because they are believed, not believed because they are true. Factitious virtue shares features with both placebo effects and self-fulfilling prophecies: like the former, it involves beliefs about oneself; like the latter, it is caused, in part, by the belief in its own existence. Alfano supports his argument by reference to a rich record of medical, anthropological, epistemological, and psychological research on placebo effects, self-fulfilling prophecies, and trait-labelling.

If virtue-labelling really is so efficacious, hasn't Alfano ended up contradicting his claim that most people lack virtue? Not really. Factitious virtue differs from neo-Aristotelian virtue in requiring constant social reinforcement and, therefore, being temporally unstable. Further, someone who is only factitiously virtuous is motivated by the desire to maintain her image of herself as virtuous -- her self-conception -- and to live up to others' expectations of her, whereas someone who is virtuous in the Aristotelian sense is, typically, motivated by the virtue itself.

Alfano contrasts virtue-labelling with the Aristotelian method of habituation, which requires acting according to virtue for the right reason with pleasure. I wonder, however, why Alfano doesn't recognize that even though his theory of virtue-labelling is new in the philosophical literature, the practice is not. In addition to using other methods of habituation with kids, many, many parents, teachers, and others have been attributing virtues to kids all along out of the same tacit sense that doing so would encourage them to be virtuous. Certainly my parents and teachers did, and I have no reason to think that they were unique. Even adults sometimes attribute virtues to each other on the basis of the potential they see in each other. So many of us should have at least factitious virtue. But according to Alfano (for reasons that are unclear to me), factitious virtue is global, and the burden of his argument has been that globally virtuous behavior is not to be found. So if I am right that the practice of virtue-labelling is old, it seems that it is not quite as efficacious as Alfano thinks.

Along the way, Alfano provides a highly illuminating discussion of the various psychological mechanisms, most of which have not been discussed before by philosophers, that lead many to believe that people have global traits (53-61). (Note, once again, that Alfano does not claim that it's a mistake to attribute wide-ranging traits to people). He also discusses attempts to defend virtue ethics from the situationist critique. These attempts are amusingly called The Dodge (virtue is rare), The Retreat (the virtues are local; there are only virtuous acts), and The Counterattack (situationism is mistaken). I agree with Alfano that the first response is problematic if global virtue is supposed to be a realizable ideal, and that the second and third are unsatisfactory. But it's premature to declare that virtue ethics "rests on a foundation of sand" (82). Alfano needs to take more seriously the view that the picture of near perfection we get from Aristotle is meant only as a regulative ideal to aspire to, not reach. He also needs to take more seriously the idea that if, e.g., Justine is just in many, many important but narrowly-defined contexts, and unjust in a few less important ones, then her aggregated justice is wide-ranging. Hence one-off virtuous acts and local virtues are not the only alternatives to global virtue. It's because our trait-signatures are so complicated that only those who know us well can predict our behavior in a given situation with near certainty. These are legitimate auxiliary hypotheses that save the hard core of virtue ethics.

Part II

Alfano launches the first sustained situationist challenge to reliabilist and responsibilist virtue epistemology. According to reliabilism, knowledge is true belief produced by intellectual virtue, where intellectual virtues are well-functioning or reliable faculties such as sight, or inferential processes such as induction or deduction. Thus, the true belief that the cat is on the mat amounts to knowledge if it is based on one's perception or on a stable disposition to use sound rules of inference.

Responsibilism models intellectual virtue on Aristotelian moral virtue. Thus, Linda Zagzebski defines it as "a deep and enduring acquired excellence of a person, involving a characteristic motivation to produce a certain desired end and reliable success in bringing about that end" (cited in Alfano: 116). Knowledge is true belief produced by intellectual virtue.

Both reliabilist and responsibilist virtue epistemologists are thus committed to holding that if most people lack intellectual virtue, most people lack knowledge. Alfano argues, however, that this is counterintuitive. If most people lack intellectual virtue, it's better to give up the premise that knowledge has to be produced by intellectual virtue. His argument that most people lack intellectual virtues is similar to his argument that most people lack moral virtues: epistemic conduct is susceptible to a host of trivial and epistemically irrelevant situational influences and mood elevators and depressors, so intellectual virtues fail to explain or predict much epistemic conduct (Ch. 5).

Alfano argues that dozens of experiments show that responsibilist virtues like creativity and flexibility are empirically inadequate. Thus, in the Duncker candle task, only 13% in the control condition were able to solve the task, but after participants in an experimental condition had their mood elevated, 75% were able to solve it (121-22). In experiments with medical interns, although most were able to solve the problem, those who had just been given candy, or had their mood elevated some other way, did it quickest and with more flexibility (123). As in the case of helpful action, so here, what apparently does the trick is the openness to new experiences and ideas produced by a good mood (124). Some psychologists believe that a good mood also improves recall and the ability to make connections between different things. But the effects of a good mood last only for about 20 minutes at a time. Here, again, Alfano concludes that most people lack creativity or flexibility; what they have is creativity/flexibility-in-a-good-mood. So either there is no such thing as knowledge or problem-solving, or it doesn't require intellectual virtue.

Alfano's conclusion that most people lack creativity or flexibility implies, however, that the medical interns who solved the problems less efficiently than the ones in a good mood exercised no creativity or flexibility. What, then, did they exercise in order to arrive at the solutions? The experiments show only that a good mood increases creativity and flexibility by creating an openness to new experiences and ideas and the ability to make new connections. True, the baseline is pretty low in the case of the candle test, and the same may be true of many other such tests. But solving such puzzles isn't everyone's cup of tea, and is even somewhat anxiety-inducing, especially in a lab. Before concluding that most people simply lack the virtue of creativity, Alfano needs to show that most people are bad at solving most kinds of problems: practical problems of everyday living at work and at home, technical problems in carpentry or computing, and intellectual problems in their areas of expertise. Everyday experience, however, suggests that most people are good at solving many kinds of problems.

However, as in the moral case, so here, Alfano points out that a disposition is not virtuous if exercising it well depends on a good mood produced by irrelevant factors such as candy or comedy. But this would be cause for worry only if people's creativity typically depended on such irrelevant factors, and the experimental evidence does not support this generalization. Nor is there any real-life evidence that people who are good at solving intellectual, technical, or practical problems consume massive quantities of candy or comedy throughout the day. They may well be in a good mood when they solve problems, for the prospect of solving problems in their areas of interest or expertise is pleasurable and exciting to most people. But such excitement is inherent in, or at least closely related to, creativity, and its cause lies in the task itself, not in irrelevant situational factors.

Alfano's argument that most people are sadly lacking in intellectual courage is more persuasive. Alfano provides a superb taxonomy and discussion of the varieties of courage, showing that intellectual courage is crucial for both practical and theoretical knowledge (126-136). In particular, the courage to express our views publicly is "one of the few ways to break the stranglehold of pluralistic ignorance," that is, mutually-sustained ignorance of some norm or fact (128). Yet both experimental evidence and everyday experience show that few of us have the courage to speak up in the face of (what we take to be) near-unanimous dissent. This argument, however, does not challenge the virtue epistemologist, since, by hypothesis, those who don't speak up know the truth they dare not utter. To refute the virtue epistemologist, Alfano needs to show that people know a lot even though they lack intellectual courage; instead, he defends the responsibilist's claim that intellectual courage is crucial for knowledge.

Against reliabilism, Alfano argues that cognitive psychology indicates that all of us, even experts, form most of our beliefs on the basis of heuristics, and heuristics are unreliable (Ch. 6). So most of our knowledge is based on unreliable inferential dispositions. Alfano's treatment of this much-disputed issue is highly informative, but the reader will need to decide for herself if Alfano's skepticism about reliabilism is justified.

To conclude, although I don't think Alfano succeeds in showing that most people cannot be morally or epistemically virtuous in a wide range of circumstances, his book makes very rewarding reading.

[1] Maria Merritt, John Doris, Gilbert Harman, “Character,” The Moral Psychology Handbook (Oxford University Press, 2010); Christian Miller, Moral Character (Oxford University Press, 2013).

[2] In “The Limited Unity of Virtue” I argue that global virtue is psychologically impossible because no one can meet the epistemic and emotional requirements of Aristotelian virtue (Nous 30 (3): 306–329).