Characters in Search of Their Author: The Gifford Lectures, 1999-2000

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McInerny, Ralph, Characters in Search of Their Author: The Gifford Lectures, 1999-2000, University of Notre Dame Press, 2001, 152 pp, $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-268-02261-5.

Reviewed by Thomas Williams, University of Iowa


Ralph McInerny’s Gifford Lectures, published under the title Characters in Search of Their Author, must have delighted the “cultivated but non-professional audience” (xi) to which they were addressed. They are lively and wide-ranging discourses on the decline of natural theology and its prospects for recovery within contemporary philosophy, with reflections on the relationship between faith and reason, presented in a colloquial idiom and governed throughout by McInerny’s genial Thomism. But the omissions and inconsequences that may escape notice in the lecture hall become all too evident on the printed page, and even the non-professional reader of Characters in Search of Their Author is likely to wish that McInerny had imposed a stricter order on his material and fleshed out the many arguments he merely sketches.

In Part One, “Whatever Happened to Natural Theology?”, McInerny sets out to explain how philosophy became inhospitable to natural theology. Even after repeated readings, I have found the story difficult to follow, since it seems to be told in no particular order, whether logical or chronological. One version of the story is given in Lecture Two, “Friends and Foes of Natural Theology.” We begin with Descartes’s “subjective turn” (17). McInerny tells us that this turn “can be said to have ushered in a happy time for natural theology” (Ibid.), since a proof for the existence of God is held to be not merely possible but in fact a necessary condition for knowledge of the external world. Almost immediately, however, we are told that “atheism was already latent in the Cartesian turn” (18)—a claim that is asserted on the authority of Cornelio Fabro and often repeated, but nowhere defended, so far as I can see. It needs defense, especially after we are assured that Descartes himself was a devout Roman Catholic and that his philosophical work was inspired by a religious experience (34-35). How did the work of this devout natural theologian contain the seeds of the current hostility to natural theology? We are not told. From Descartes we move to Porphyry and his commentators, who recognized but did not overestimate the contribution the mind itself makes to things when it knows them; thence to the epistemological turn, after which “our mind’s contribution becomes increasingly dominant and defining of reality” (20); and then, through Russell, Ayer, Wittgenstein, and Sartre, to a radical anti-realism: “There is no there there of which our knowledge could be the true expression. Mental activity is no longer the grasp of the real, there being no real to grasp” (26). At the end of this story, McInerny remarks, “Despite the accommodations that some theists have made to one passing form of philosophy or another, it is increasingly clear that theism presupposes a pretty thorough rejection of what has been going on in philosophy in the last third of the second millennium. As Fabro has argued … something begins with Descartes that has atheism as its logical consequence” (28).

Lecture Three retells some of this history, this time beginning with two encyclicals that called for creative philosophical resistance to the atheistic tendencies of modern thought: Gaudium et spes (1965) and Aeterni Patris (1879). Back we then go to Descartes and Pascal, whose mystical experiences and religious motivation are now described. Once again it seems puzzling that such devout men could have laid the foundations for philosophical atheism, and here McInerny raises the question that might help us solve the puzzle: “How do the attitudes of Pascal and Descartes to their faith differ from that which characterized the Scholastic tradition it was Descartes’s intention to replace?” (37). Presumably, the discussion of Anselm that begins immediately after this question is meant to serve as an answer, but it is difficult to make out what that answer is supposed to be. From Anselm we move on to Nietzsche, understood as a proponent of the nihilism that is subjected to scrutiny in Lecture Four, “Radical Chic.” Here Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, and Thomas Reid gang up on those who would deny the principle of non-contradiction. The standard philosopher, who in the First Lecture was a self-described paragon of reason (“He ponders the question, he considers solutions, he weighs the possibilities, he makes his dispassionate judgment” [7]), is now a proponent of Nietzschean unreason, of anything-goes Protagorean relativism. The problem here is not so much that McInerny’s target has shifted as that the new target is a straw philosopher. Contemporary Anglo-American philosophers, if they are anti-realists at all, apply their carefully qualified anti-realism to limited domains. They are not global irrationalists; indeed, they arrive at their anti-realism on the basis of arguments. And if they deny, as many do, that human beings can prove the existence of God by natural reason, they do so because they have dispassionately weighed the arguments for God’s existence and found them wanting, not because they blithely assume that there is no truth of any kind to be known by anyone. To these unbelieving philosophers—and to their believing colleagues who share this verdict on the success of natural theology—McInerny seems to have nothing to say.

Part Two is called “The Recovery of Natural Theology.” The sixth lecture, “Aspects of Argument,” puts forward Aquinas’s argument from motion, the first of the Five Ways. McInerny then offers a stripped-down version of the argument, with a verdict on its validity:

In its stark simplicity, the proof would be stated thus:

*Whatever is moved is moved by another. *There cannot be an infinite series of moved movers. *Therefore there must be a first unmoved mover.

Appraised formally, from the point of view of logic, this proof works. The problem thus becomes one of knowing whether the consequent is true, not whether it is truly consequent upon the premises. How is this to be decided? By finding out whether the premises from which it logically follows are true. (76)

Now the argument is not in fact valid: from the two premises it follows only that not all movers are moved, not that there is exactly one unmoved mover. But leaving that problem aside, I note that McInerny never proceeds to evaluate the truth of those premises. (Certainly we are never told that John Duns Scotus, no foe of natural theology, emphatically denied the first premise.)

Instead, the next lecture focuses on “the difference between changing one’s mind and changing one’s life” (83). McInerny’s aim is to address the misgiving that a successful proof for the existence of God ought not merely to convince those who accept it but also to produce a change in their behavior. He first elaborates Aquinas’s characterization of the differences between practical and theoretical thinking. On that basis he notes first that it seems unreasonable to demand that a proof for the existence of God, which is a piece of theoretical thinking, should have immediate practical consequences. After all, even moral knowledge, which belongs to practical thinking, often fails in its aim of guiding behavior. And yet, McInerny claims, there clearly is a practical upshot to theoretical knowledge about God, since what we come to know about God is that he is our ultimate end. As he seems to acknowledge, however, the argument from motion does not in fact establish that God is our ultimate end, or indeed an end of any kind. He here (92) notes that there are other proofs that do purport to establish this, but he fails even to state one, let alone analyze one.

In Lecture Eight, “Truth and Subjectivity,” McInerny turns to two nineteenth-century thinkers who seek to banish the theoretical knowledge of God and substitute for it something more akin to practical knowledge. Kierkegaard “absorbs the whole range of issues that had belonged to natural theology into the practical or subjective order. The truth that God exists is established by living as if he existed” (99-100). John Henry Newman holds “that what Aristotle called phronesis, which he confined to the practical order, can be extended to all reasoning on concrete matters” (101). Thus described, their projects must be pronounced “wrongheaded,” McInerny says; Aquinas’s development of the distinction between theoretical and practical reasoning shows that it makes no sense to think of the existence of God as “the object of a true judgment of practical reason” (102). But a more benign interpretation of their thought notes that even theoretical reasoning is subject to practical evaluation: the would-be natural theologian can carry out his project in morally admirable or morally blameworthy ways. As virtue is required to guarantee that general practical knowledge will issue in correct judgments concerning particular practical matters, so also the right disposition is required to carry the theoretical reasoner smoothly to correct judgments concerning the theoretical matters dealt with in natural theology. As McInerny puts it, “Subjectivity is not the immediate source of objective truth, but there is a kind of subjective disposition that is open to objective truth and another that is closed even to its possibility” (107).

Lecture Nine, “That God Exists,” abruptly returns to the argument from motion. McInerny notes again that the success of the argument depends on the truth of its premises and now adds that the premises are not self-evident: they require proof. Instead of attempting such a proof, however, he argues that we should not dismiss Aristotle’s analysis of motion simply because it was part of a natural philosophy that has now been largely abandoned. (He comes perilously close to suggesting that the analysis of motion must be correct because Aristotle cannot have been wrong about everything [113].) According to McInerny, that analysis belongs to a view that is pre-scientific, not in the sense that it is destined to be superseded by science, but rather in the sense that it is a part of the data that any genuine science must accommodate and explain.

The great value of McInerny’s lectures is the cheerful confidence of the Thomistic picture of natural theology that they paint for the reader. It is a grand and appealing portrait of the powers and limitations of natural reason, and its sometimes shabby treatment at the hands of modern thinkers. Too often, however, the picture remains merely impressionistic, with a dab of polemical history here and a dab of hurried argument there. McInerny would have been more helpful to the sincere inquirer—and truer to the methods of Aquinas himself—if he had drawn a sharper picture, one careful brushstroke at a time.