Charles Darwin

Placeholder book cover

Michael Ruse, Charles Darwin, Blackwell Publishing, 2008, 337pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405149136.

Reviewed by Bruce Weber, California State University, Fullerton/Bennington College


Michael Ruse needs no introduction to anyone who has read about the philosophy of biology or the controversies surrounding Darwinism over the past three-and-a-half decades. Ruse, the Lucyle T. Werkmeister Professor of Philosophy at Florida State University, is the author of numerous books on the historical and philosophical aspects of Darwinism (which are characterized by lucid and lively prose) as well as the founding editor of the journal Biology and Philosophy. In Charles Darwin, a volume in the Blackwell Great Minds series, Ruse addresses Darwin's key insights about evolution as presented primarily in On the Origin of Species and The Descent of Man and as they continue to inform the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis (aka neo-Darwinism), as well as their implications for epistemology, ethics, psychology, and religion. Although ostensibly focusing on Charles Darwin's thought, Ruse's real topic is Darwinism as a scientific research tradition and naturalistic worldview and how, as such, it deals with philosophical issues such as progress, purpose and apparent design, as well as the impact of professionalization on evolutionary discourse. These are subjects that Ruse has dealt with in greater detail and depth in a series of relatively recent books: Darwinism Defended, The Darwinian Paradigm, Monad to Man, Mystery of Mysteries, Evolutionary Naturalism, The Evolution Wars, Can a Darwinian be a Christian?, Darwin and Design, The Evolution-Creation Struggle, and Darwinism and it Discontents, as well as in volumes he has co-edited: Debating Design (with William Dembski) and most recently The Philosophy of Biology (with David Hull). These various strands of Ruse's study and thought are brought together here in a single, updated, moderate-length volume that addresses general, serious-minded readers, as well as students, who wish an introductory overview of Ruse's understanding of Darwinism. For information about Darwin himself such readers need to refer to the standard biographies of Janet Browne (1995, 2002) and of Adrian Desmond and James Moore (1991). Readers also could profitably pursue the analysis of Darwinism and its transformation into neo-Darwinism by reading the work of Timothy Shanahan (2004).

Ruse approaches Darwin's long argument in On the Origin of Species in terms of John Herschel’s notion of vera causa and William Whewell’s 'consilience of inductions'. Ruse argues that these notions allowed Darwin to cast his case for common descent caused by natural selection in Newtonian methodological terms that complied with the dictates of the fledgling work on the history and philosophy of science in the 1830s and 1840s. Darwin had seen the negative response to evolutionary speculations that did not meet these dictates in the case of The Vestiges of Creation so he realized that he had to present and justify his controversial ideas within a methodological framework that instantiated the highest principles of the inductive sciences as then understood.

How many unprepared readers have wondered about the fact that the opening of Darwin's magnum opus deals with pigeon breeding? Indeed, one referee for Darwin's publisher John Murray argued that this section should be expanded at the expense of the rest since books on pigeons always sell. The important point is that the literature of plant and animal breeders provided Darwin with observable examples of the potential of a selective force on the variable, heritable characteristics of living things over generational time. This force acted in analogy to the selection, posited by Darwin, that occurs in nature due to differential survival and reproduction in specific environments over geological time. Such illustrations of true causes or vera causae followed the Newtonian methodology of studying observable and quantifiable mechanical systems, such as motion on inclined planes or the balance of inertial and central forces acting on a mechanical system (e.g., a rock being swung on a string) in which the forces could be measured and the causal consequences observed. Thus when Newton calculated the resultant orbits of the balance of inertial forces of motion and the gravitational central forces acting on planets revolving around the sun, the gravitational force could be accepted as causal since such central forces had been shown to be causally effective in the mechanical analogues. By Darwin's use of the artificial selection of breeders such an approach to the cause of common descent by means of natural selection was more likely to be accepted or at least seem scientifically plausible than the sorts of speculations of the likes of Robert Chambers and others that did not achieve much traction among the scientific elite. Ruse argues for a weak sense of Darwin's Newtonianism, whereas David Depew and I have argued for a strong sense in which Darwin can be viewed as working within a general Newtonian paradigm (Depew and Weber 1995). Be that as it may, since this is really a book about Darwinism and not just Darwin, Ruse brings in the results of a number of more recent studies, such as those of Peter and Rosemary Grant on the Galapagos finches as well as work in population genetics and molecular evolution, that provide overwhelming detailed support for the causal efficacy of natural selection as the primary, if not sole, causal factor in producing evolutionary phenomena.

In a similar fashion, Ruse suggests that Darwin used Whewell's notion of a 'consilience of inductions' in structuring the bulk of his presentation in On the Origin of Species as well as in updating the consilience of evidence for common descent. Darwin certainly was familiar with Whewell's thought, especially about natural laws, though he never explicitly used the term 'consilience' as he had the term 'vera causa'. Whewell had argued that a successful scientific theory (e.g., Newton's theory of gravitation) not only explained the phenomena that went into its development (thereby providing a unifying understanding of the phenomena by the action of the law of gravity) but also additional relevant phenomena. In other words, a successful theory should make sense of an interrelated range of phenomena, even phenomena not used in the development of the theory. Newton's theory applied to the solar system correctly derives the planetary orbits as well as Kepler's three laws of motion. In addition Newton's laws allowed for the prediction of planets not previously observed and a slight asymmetry in the earth's shape due to the sun's gravity. Darwin's principle of selection-driven divergence, and, over geological time scales, common descent, was supported by evidence from studies on animal instincts, hybrids, paleontology, biogeography (especially island biogeography), systematics, morphology, and embryology -- a disparate range of phenomena indeed. Ruse devotes two chapters to the issue of consilience, bringing the evidence up to date with many more recent examples including those drawn from paleontology, plate tectonics, cladistics, and of course molecular biology. The data from protein and nucleic acid sequence studies provide overwhelming support for common descent. However, such studies also reveal that many mutations in proteins and genomes that have been fixed in the lineages of contemporary species appear to be selectively neutral. Ruse explores the controversies that surrounded the suggestion by Motoo Kimura that much of molecular evolution was neutral. Ruse concludes reasonably that such neutral processes do not threaten the importance of natural selection but indeed provide a basis for greater variation. Ruse could have gone further and shown how such neutrality in the molecular and cellular hierarchy, coupled with gene duplication mechanisms, allows access to new catalytic functions as well as an interplay of drift and selection at multiple levels.

Ruse ruminates on the nature of laws in science and how laws in biology are necessarily different from those in physics because of the fact of biological function and historicity as well as the degree of variability in biological systems and populations. This is important foundational work for understanding the conceptual basis of the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis as well as later chapters about the applications of Darwinism more broadly to human phenomena. To deal with function, Ruse argues, Darwin had to make use of the metaphor of design. Eyes function and exist that animals might see. Thus eyes are adaptations for which Darwin seeks a causal explanation via selection acting upon natural variation in a specific environment. Ruse asserts that Darwin was very indirectly influenced by Kant through Georges Cuvier and Robert Grant. Kant had argued that function and the metaphor of design were distinctive characteristics of biology, leading him to conclude that there would never be the Newton of a blade of grass. Darwin's triumph was to make this metaphor plausible within a Newtonian conceptual scheme, as David Depew and I have argued (Depew and Weber 1995).

Ultimately the relationship between physical and biological laws and phenomena has to be addressed; this involves confronting the problem of the origin of life within a fully naturalistic context. Adrian Desmond suggests that Darwin (at least in his public writings) bracketed off the problem of the origin of life from that of evolutionary theory for both scientific and political reasons. But, if either a reductionist program (say reducing population genetics to molecular biology) or an emergentist program accounting for the emergence of genuinely novel biological structures and phenomena due to complex systems dynamics is going to be successful. it will be necessary to bring research on the origin of life within the Darwinian orbit. So Ruse provides a brief synopsis of the origin-of-life research done in the 1920s by J.B.S. Haldane and A.I. Oparin, the mid-century experiments of Stanley Miller and Harold Urey, and the work of Stuart Kauffman and Pier Luigi Luisi in the 1990s. Ruse correctly points out that the origin of life is not only a legitimate scientific question but also an important philosophical one that entails seeking the definition of life and the relation of physical and biological theories. Ruse however fails to realize it is here that the importance of self-organizing phenomena and their explanation by complex systems dynamical theory have and will play an important role not only in developing a robust account of the emergence of life and its evolution in terms of its dissipative requirements, but also in potentially pointing the way toward an extended Darwinian paradigm as a logical consequence of integrating the origin of life into evolutionary theory. Stuart Kauffman has addressed both the scientific and philosophical issues arising from such an understanding of the origin of life in his Investigations (Kauffman 2000). Ruse neither addresses nor cites Kauffman’s more recent theorizing or efforts informed by complex system dynamics in general.

Ruse next moves to the development of the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis in which Darwinism and Mendelism were combined through population genetics. (Although Ruse does not cite him, readers should consult Jean Gayon on this topic [Gayon 1998].) Ruse does not deal sufficiently with the problems that Darwinism encountered subsequent to Darwin's death nor does he fully enunciate the conceptual triumph achieved by the neo-Darwinism developed from the 1920s through the 1940s. Ruse does point out that this new synthetic theory of evolution was more formal and mathematical than the original Darwinism, but he does not consider those aspects of this synthesis that were marginalized or just assumed reducible to population genetics (e.g., developmental phenomena). When Ruse considers the implications of applying Darwinian thought beyond biological phenomena, he assumes that there is a single synthesis and that recent work in molecular genetics and developmental biology are unproblematic for the dominant role of population genetics. Some argue, however, that there are indeed two "tendencies" or "wings" of the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis, one (say, Fisher/Dawkins) is more reductive to population genetics and selection as the sole causality, the other (say, Wright/Dobzhansky) is less genocentric and more causally pluralistic, although selection is acknowledged as the primary factor in evolution (Sterelny 2001, Depew and Weber 1995, Grene and Depew 2004). Such considerations would necessarily lengthen Ruse's book, but they would provide a more general context for his exploration, in later chapters, of issues about Darwinism’s broader implications. A case in point is Ruse's discussion of the notions of "spandrels" introduced by Niles Eldredge and Stephen Jay Gould. Spandrels make little sense in the more narrowly causal version of the synthesis that Ruse espouses but can be coherent in the more causally pluralistic version that Eldredge and Gould embraced. Ruse draws his line in the sand delineating what he will accept as Darwinian. This is unfortunate since the problem of bringing developmental phenomena fully into the modern evolutionary synthesis remains a key issue for both evolutionary theory and the philosophy of biology, and while a hard problem for either version of the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis, "genocentric" or "organocentric," there is greater hope of progress with the more pluralistic version.

The second half of Charles Darwin shifts focus to the arguments of The Descent of Man with its novel notion of sexual selection and innovative theory of emotions. Ruse treats it as he did On the Origin of Species by summarizing Darwin's presentation and then examining the current discussions and controversies that flow from Darwin's insights. Ruse sees Hume as the background influence that framed the naturalistic spirit of applying evolutionary thinking to humans. According to Ruse, Darwin had less to say about religion than morality because by 1870 the battle over God was largely over for the Victorian elite. Ruse does acknowledge that neither Herschell nor Whewell accepted Darwin's claims for that natural selection causes common descent on the grounds that Darwin’s theory did not meet the requirements of inductive science. Yet as the 1870s progressed the tide shifted toward Darwin. Ruse here hints at some of the major changes in the social context of science that occurred during Darwin's lifetime, changes which ultimately led to Darwin being buried in Westminster Abbey next to Newton. Ruse does not address this issue further, but it has been fully analyzed by Adrian Desmond and James Moore (1991). Ruse also does not explore either the social context or Darwin's attitudes towards slavery, racism, and imperialism that provided an important background to Darwin's second major work and played a role in shaping Darwin's arguments (Moore and Desmond 2004).

Ruse does show how insights and implications in The Descent of Man form the conceptual basis of the more recently developed sociobiology and evolutionary sociology. Ruse concludes that Darwin was right that biology does matter for understanding humans even as he acknowledges that humans are more than inherited biology. However, Ruse does not analyze the reasons for resistance among some social scientists to these extensions of Darwinism as acknowledged, for example, by David Sloane Wilson. Here recognition that there are two versions of the Modern Evolutionary Synthesis could be helpful: rejection of the universality of some claims of evolutionary psychology does not have to mean rejection of Darwinism if that Darwinism is cast in a broader conceptual context. By implication, Ruse will have none of such causal pluralism and wants to keep Darwinism safe for his causally narrow version of the evolutionary synthesis. In his discussion on the relationship of Darwinism and pragmatism, Ruse concludes that each has to have an essential element of chance, even as there can be progress from simplicity to complexity due to the necessity imposed by natural selection. Ruse argues that Bertrand Russell's famous attack on pragmatism held back the development of an evolutionary epistemology by many decades.

Ruse concludes with chapters on the controversies involving religion and summarizes some of the current attempts to provide an evolutionary account for the universality of religious feeling in the human species. As with any specific topic Ruse addresses, the reader could, and should, want more detail and depth in the chapters that deal with religion. It is to be hoped that readers will turn to other books by Ruse mentioned above, but also that they will read more widely. For example, Ruse touches on the problem of evil in his discussion of the controversies involving "intelligent design" but does not point the reader to theologians (such as James Haught or Christopher Southgate) who see Darwin as having provided those wrestling with issues of theodicy a great gift in understanding the source of what appears to be natural evil. Such omissions are understandable given the very large range of topics discussed and concepts explored in a very limited space. Besides, it would not be half as interesting a read if his book did not pungently reflect Ruse's personal viewpoints. Anyone who has been in discussion with Ruse knows that he likes to have the last word, and I'll let him have it here:

[Darwin's] theory of evolution through natural selection, as given in the Origin of Species, changes forever the way that we look at the world and how we understand ourselves. This has implications in every area of human thought, including -- especially including – philosophy. (307)


Browne, J. (1995). Charles Darwin: Voyaging. London: Jonathan Cape.

Browne, J. (2002). Charles Darwin: The Power of Place. London: Jonathan Cape.

Depew, D.J. and B.H. Weber (1995). Darwinism Evolving: Systems Dynamics and the Genealogy of Natural Selection. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Desmond, A. and J. Moore (1991). Darwin. London: Michael Joseph.

Gayon, J. (1998). Darwinism's Struggle for Survival: Heredity and the Hypothesis of Natural Selection. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Grene, M. and D. Depew (2004). The Philosophy of Biology: An Episodic History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kauffman, S.A. (2000). Investigations. New York: Oxford University Press.

Moore, J. and A. Desmond (2004). "Introduction," in Charles Darwin The Descent of Man, and Selection in Relation to Sex. London: Penguin Books, pp xi-lxiv.

Shanahan, T. (2004). The Evolution of Darwinism: Selection, Adaptation and Progress in Evolution. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Sterelny, K. (2001). The Evolution of Agency and Other Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.