Charles Taylor, Michael Polanyi and the Critique of Modernity: Pluralist and Emergentist Directions

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Charles W. Lowney II (ed.), Charles Taylor, Michael Polanyi and the Critique of Modernity: Pluralist and Emergentist Directions, Palgrave Macmillan, 2017, 290pp., $119.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319638973.

Reviewed by Charles Blattberg, Université de Montréal


How wonderful when intellectual titans meet and we get to listen in. Often, as here, there is much to learn.

In 2014, in San Diego, Charles Taylor participated in the annual meeting of the Polanyi Society, and this book consists largely of the papers presented and the discussions held there. Of course Michael Polanyi, who died in 1976, could not attend. But the Polanyi scholars who did succeeded in doing a fine job of questioning, agreeing with, and criticising Taylor's ideas -- even if this volume also suggests how much further such engagement might go.

Following an introduction by the editor, the book is divided into three parts. The first opens with a chapter by Taylor in which he basically retells, albeit in a new way, the compressed story first related in his landmark 1987 paper, "Overcoming Epistemology" -- with an added focus on Polanyi, to be sure, but also Hume. Essentially, Taylor offers an account of how we move past the errors associated with the conception, first advanced by Descartes, of knowledge as deriving from the mechanistic combination of ideas conceived as isolable bits, when we follow those who replace this atomism with one or another form of holism. Next comes an edited transcript of a wide-ranging discussion between Taylor, his fellow panelists, and some members of the audience. Topics include: embodiment, ritual, the notion of a pre-reflective background, realism, incommensurability, interpretation, nihilism, evil, teleology, evolutionary theory, biblical religion, dialogue, beauty, and truth.

The second part begins with John V. Apczynski's intriguing claim that Taylor can be read as extending Polanyi's scientific insights about nature into religious and political contexts -- more on this later. Then follows a chapter by Charles W. Lowney II on the overlap between the key concepts of emergence for Polanyi and authenticity for Taylor. While fascinating, the discussion appears to be based on an anachronistic, because post-Romantic, reading of Aristotle. At one point, Lowney even claims that Aristotle's notion of making (poeisis) contains "the heart" of Marx's idea of alienation (p. 81). In fact, Marx builds on Hegel's recognition, following Adam Smith, that Aristotle was wrong to think that production affects only the external world; on the contrary, it's also an economic activity (and so a praxis) that can transform the producer (Planty-Bonjour 1983).

Finally, David James Stewart draws on some of Polanyi's ideas to suggest that we need to avoid becoming overly complacent about the meanings of our most cherished concepts -- preparing the way for his complaint that Taylor fails to make room for a conception of the Christian God that strikes me as frankly non-Christian, because naturalistic rather than transcendent. While there are times when religions should be open to changing central beliefs, there are also limits; a given change can be so radical that it would be necessary, as here, to speak of a different religion. It is particularly ironic to find Stewart supporting his "post-supernatural form of Christianity" with reference to a citation by Polanyi of the Protestant theologian Paul Tillich (p. 111), since Tillich's God is, for a Christian (though not a Jew or a Muslim), especially transcendent. Tillich was a part of that minority Christian tradition, traceable from Origen of Alexandria all the way to Karl Barth, for whom God the Father is "Wholly Other" rather than merely a higher form of (natural or otherwise) being.

The third part opens with Jon Fennell's puzzlement as to why Taylor did not take advantage of the possibilities made available by the connection between Polanyi's conception of interpretation, or "sense-reading," and his proposals of new, indeed revolutionary, social and cosmic imaginaries (an imaginary consists largely of the background "unthoughts," to use Foucault's expression, that help us make sense of the world, i.e. of certain unarticulated ideas that we have about it). My hunch is that Taylor is simply too practical a philosopher to find Polanyi's conceptions compelling. They strike me as basically aesthetic, in the sense that they involve such disinterested activities as savouring beauty, playing for fun, fantasizing, or performing a spectacle. Polanyi's social imaginary, for example, is said to call for free individuals of a kind that he writes about under the heading "Conviviality" (p. 127) and whose freedom supports intellectual disciplines in which research is performed strictly out of a love of truth (p. 128) seen as beautiful (as is noted elsewhere in the book, e.g. pp. 47, 81-83, 155) or, quoting Polanyi himself, "for its own sake" (1966, pp. 3, 56, 60). As for Polanyi's cosmic imaginary, it is said not only to share with the social one a capacity for rehabilitating a "sense of enchantment" (p. 126) but also to offer us "the 'spectacle' of successive acts of emergence," in which we all "have an indispensable role to play [completing] the cosmic drama" (p. 134).

Then follow two chapters by Lowney, which together suggest that if Taylor had drawn more on Polanyi than on Heidegger or Merleau-Ponty, he would have seen how the idea that all three shared a tacit, prereflective background supports not merely an epistemology but also an ontology. In particular, this ontology is said to have the merit of discouraging the objectification of meanings central to our lives, such as those of important artworks, and so of making more room for an appreciation of the divine. But all this seems to miss how far Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty take us beyond epistemology; their school of phenomenology, after all, is not called "ontological hermeneutics" for nothing.

Then comes Diane M. Yeager's chapter, which suggests that given their different ideas about the chief threat to liberal democracy -- nihilist totalitarianism for Polanyi, and social fragmentation for Taylor -- each neglects something available from the other. Accordingly, Polanyians should take on Taylor's sense that a political society needs to be held together by a common good, while Taylor and his admirers should share in Polanyi's commitment to certain universal basic values, since this is necessary for avoiding relativism. I doubt that but, either way, Taylor (1999) has already expressed optimism about achieving such a global consensus. Finally, this part closes with another wide-ranging discussion between Taylor and the others. It touches on some of the above papers, as well as the dangers of unbridled markets, the meaning of life, and the need to avoid foundationalism, among other topics.

These conversations evoke the way both Polanyi's and Taylor's approaches are touted as supporting genuinely open-minded, constructive engagements with others. Which, of course, means being willing to admit when one is wrong, something we don't see enough of in philosophy (okay, anywhere). And throughout the meeting that gave rise to this volume, minds were in fact changed -- if only in relatively superficial ways. At one point, for example, Taylor detects (p. 216) that his interlocutors have been using the word "imaginary" somewhat differently than he does. He assumes that an imaginary must be shared by many people, while they appear to believe that it can belong to a single individual. But then Taylor admits that their way is no less valid. And Yeager, for her part, mentions that encountering Taylor's argument about how an atomist ontology of individuals can lead to social fragmentation helped her better identify an area of dissatisfaction that she has long had with Polanyi's moral anthropology (pp. 206-207). Still, given some of the significant differences between the two thinkers, one can easily imagine participants leaving the meeting sessions with enough questions that one or more of their answers eventually leads them to rethink something fundamental. There's no indication of this on the page, however.

If I've one major disappointment to report, it is the book's failure to seriously take up likely the most far-reaching difference between the two: whether there's a fundamental methodological distinction between the human and the natural sciences. Taylor has famously endorsed the idea, claiming that the former involve a double, not merely single, hermeneutic (e.g. 1985a). But Polanyi, as Apczynski describes, sees only a difference in degrees of "indwelling" (p. 63), according to which research is said to require avoiding the stance of an outsider looking in. To cite just one relevant statement by Polanyi himself: when it comes to historical and aesthetic studies, respectively, Wilhelm Dilthey and Theodor Lipps "were mistaken in asserting that this sharply distinguished the humanities from the natural sciences" (1966, p. 17; see also pp. 7, 20, 24, 35, 37, 73, 82, 84, 87, though there has been some controversy over whether Polanyi, late in his life, meant to set aside "transnatural" works of art and religion). The book, however, either ignores the issue altogether (esp. pp. 55-56, 77, 154-55, 169-87) or, when it is more or less acknowledged, downplays it (pp. 67 n. 17, 173, 204). So when Taylor himself finally addresses the matter of "this constant attempt to model social science on natural science" and states quite forcefully that "it's always going to be a losing game" (p. 223), it is a pity that no one bothers to take him up on it. "Somebody say something!" you want to cry out; alas, the panelists simply move on to another question from the audience.

Then follows an epilogue, another interesting chapter by Lowney, wholly dedicated to the issue that gives the book its subtitle. It presents Polanyi and Taylor as supporting different versions of realism: the former's emergentism, which emphasizes the place of tacit structure in grasping a unified hierarchy of irreducible levels of reality, entails a monist ontology, while the latter is seen as defending, with Hubert Dreyfus, a "flat pluralism" that "can leave pluralities radically disconnected" (pp. 255-56). But while it's true that the concluding chapter of Dreyfus and Taylor's co-written book, Retrieving Realism (2015), is titled "Plural Realism," this use of the word "plural" can easily mislead. Indeed, I would go so far as to suggest that it contributes to a confusion that has bedeviled Western philosophy since the beginning.

What's confused are the metaphysical themes of mereology and "the One and the Many". The former is concerned with reducibility, and divides holists from atomists; the latter is best understood as concerned with connectivity, and divides monists, for whom existence is unified and so exhibits a oneness, from pluralists, for whom existence is fundamentally fragmented. To be sure, there have been other ways of conceiving of monism and pluralism. Perhaps the earliest is based on theme of the quantity of existence: to monists of this sort, such as Parmenides, reality consists of a single entity, while to the pluralists who oppose them, it consists of multiple entities. Of course, Parmenides' views on existence can be said to entail automatically a radically unitary answer to questions about connectivity -- assuming that he would even accept them, since if there's only one thing, what is there to connect? But to those of us who acknowledge the existence of multiple entities, it's understandable that there would be a range of viable positions between monism and pluralism (as well as others) regarding whether and to what degree these entities are connected.

Returning to the difference between those positions and the ones regarding reducibility, there are two distinct ways it has tended to be obscured. One involves existence. It is not long before those who assert irreducibility because they take a holist position in mereology see that this implies a greater quantity of diverse entities. Nowadays, no doubt because of the word's positive connotations, they tend to describe their position as "pluralist," implying opposition to monism. But as we've just seen, "multiple" is preferable. This distinction helps us grasp how, say, Heraclitus, who is nothing if not a holist as regards reducibility, is clearly a monist rather than a pluralist as regards connectivity, if only because of his famous declaration that "it is wise to agree that all things are one." As for the second way of obscuring the difference between reducibility and connectivity, it has been encouraged by those for whom it makes sense to arrive at their monist answer to the latter by giving priority to their holist answer to the former. Think of Aristotle's hylomorphism, say, or Hegel's absolute idealism, or the physical and modal cosmology defended by Jonathan Schaffer (2010) in our own day.

With all this in mind, we are able to appreciate how emphasizing holism in mereology -- which is what Dreyfus, Taylor, Polanyi, and Lowney all do -- does not necessitate any particular position on connectivity. Indeed, Dreyfus is a pluralist, as is especially clear in the 2011 book he co-wrote with Sean Dorrance Kelly, All Things Shining, which defends what we could identify as a kathenotheist polytheism. And Taylor is a hopeful sort of monist, the hope deriving from his rather Thomist monotheism. This is why their co-authored book can only be agnostic regarding "the One and the Many," as should be evident from its final paragraph:

We can see on both the scientific and cultural-ethical levels, that we have good reasons, moral and intellectual, to press forward and attempt a unification of perspectives, but also good reasons not to be too sanguine about our prospects. It is this predicament to which our robust but plural [that is, multiple] realism does most justice. This is not by any means a dogmatic belief that no unification is possible, just a healthy suspension of judgment about its ultimate possibility, along with the recognition that further unification is well worth trying -- and even, for some of us, a faith that pushes us to go on trying. (2015, p. 168)

Regarding this fundamental ontological question, then, Polanyi and Taylor are both monists. The difference between them is that one is, we might say, in more of a hurry than the other. Take the free will versus determinism antinomy. The Polanyians appear to believe that it has already been overcome (pp. 150, 193, 236-38, 252, 257-58), while Taylor has gone no further than advancing an argument that "invites us to examine a non-dualistic conception of man" -- one that, he conjectures, will one day have the "benefit of surmounting the antimony of mechanism" (1985b, p. 186). Perhaps. I, for one, am not holding my breath.


Dreyfus, Hubert and Sean Dorrance Kelly. 2011. All Things Shining: Reading the Western Classics to Find Meaning in a Secular Age. New York: Simon & Schuster.

Dreyfus, Hubert and Charles Taylor. 2015. Retrieving Realism. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Planty-Bonjour, Guy. 1983. "Hegel's Concept of Action as Unity of Poiesis and Praxis," in Lawrence S. Stepelevich and David Lamb (eds.) Hegel's Philosophy of Action. Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.

Polanyi, Michael. 1966. The Tacit Dimension. New York: Doubleday & Company.

Schaffer, Jonathan. 2010. "Monism: The Priority of the Whole," Philosophical Review 119 (1): 31-76.

Taylor, Charles. 1985a. "Interpretation and the Sciences of Man," in Philosophy and the Human Sciences: Philosophical Papers 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Taylor, Charles. 1985b. "How Is Mechanism Conceivable?" in Human Agency and Language: Philosophical Papers 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Taylor, Charles. 1995. "Overcoming Epistemology," in Philosophical Arguments. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Taylor, Charles. 1999. "Conditions of an Unforced Consensus on Human Rights," in Joanne R. Bauer and Daniel A. Bell (eds.) The East Asian Challenge for Human Rights. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.