Charles Taylor

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Ruth Abbey (ed.), Charles Taylor, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 222pp, $20.00 (pbk) ISBN 0521805228.

Reviewed by Mark Redhead, California State University, Fullerton


There are few thinkers today, whose body of work can match the breath, conceptual distinctiveness and vitality of Charles Taylor’s. Taylor has among other things developed his own unique brand of hermeneutics, produced magisterial studies of Hegel and Western modernity, and penned a number of influential pieces on contemporary political thought, including his 1994 “Politics of Recognition” essay which has become a staple of undergraduate identity-politics courses. The full significance of Taylor is beginning to be appreciated by scholars. Within the past several years three book-length studies have appeared in English. The book under review here is the second edited volume of critical essays devoted to Taylor’s work. The first volume, Philosophy in an Age of Pluralism edited by James Tully (Cambridge: 1994) contained a series of varied essays responding to the many facets of Taylor’s career, from his work as an intellectual historian, to his critique of behavioralist social sciences, to his political theory, to his involvement in Canadian politics. The contributions were also varied in their reception of Taylor with some such as the piece by Quentin Skinner quite critical of Taylor. This volume, while not nearly as varied in either its subject matter or its tone, does do an excellent job of introducing the central features of Taylor’s thought as well as the uniqueness of it. Moreover, the contributors do well at chronicling Taylor’s many influences including Hegel, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Murdoch and Berlin.

The book has nine chapters. The first is a concise introduction by Ruth Abbey that does an excellent job at whetting the reader’s appetite for all of what is to follow, which is often a rarity in such collections. The rest can roughly be divided into three groupings; Taylor the philosopher, Taylor the political theorist, and Taylor the chronicler of life in a secular age (though there is considerable overlap among these categories).

The essays by Nicholas Smith and by Hubert Dreyfus fall into the first category. Smith’s essay provides a very good introduction to Taylorian hermeneutics, his account of how humans function as self-interpretative beings. The piece reads like an introduction to the most important sections of Smith’s excellent book on Taylor as he rearticulates the theme of his thorough study of Taylor that it is meaning in relation to human existence which is Taylor’s primary concern as a philosopher. He notes how Taylor is partly able to square the hermeneutic circle by providing a means of making sense of the binding force of our moral demands/prejudices. Smith also alludes to a key claim he successfully defends in his larger study of Taylor: that Taylor’s own brand of hermeneutics does have sufficient epistemological resources to overcome the Habermasian critique of neo-Aristotelian models of practical reasoning as being unable to unmask systematically distorted forms of communication within the given life-world in which its practitioners are situated. Dreyfus covers much of the same territory as Smith, while explicating what he calls Taylor’s pluralist and realist anti-epistemology that collapses the inner/outer distinction central to post-Cartesian epistemology. Dreyfus provides a nuanced defense of Taylor against a Cartesian- or Matrix-inspired brain-in-a-vat fantasy, noting that all Taylor needs to show is that humans always cope with (and hence respond to) a perceived reality (p.62). Against Rorty here, Dreyfus argues that Taylor shows how our phenomenological acts of coping point us towards the realization that we can understand that nature exists (as what we are coping in response to) and that we can progressively generate better understandings of nature. These understandings are pluralist because there might be many languages that correctly describe the universe though there isn’t one that exclusively does so (p.79).

Melissa Orlie and Stephen Mulhall provide two original contributions to what has become a large yet sterile secondary literature on Taylor’s political thought. Orlie’s piece is the most interesting because it deals with a genre of contemporary theory that rarely engages Taylor’s thought, and which Taylor rarely engages himself: feminist theory. Orlie does an excellent job chronicling why feminists, particularly those under the spell of Nietzsche and Foucault, should seek to incorporate a politics of the good into their frameworks. She also reiterates a point made by several critics that Taylor’s thought evinces a tension between the partiality of his reading how identity is conceived as something never quite exhausted by our articulations of it and his support for the recognition of static notions of identity such as those put forth by the Parti Québécois in Quebec in the name of cultural survival. Despite his skepticism towards postmodernism, Taylor, Orlie reasons, could learn a lot by incorporating the insights of third-wave feminists like Judith Butler into the effects of power in shaping identity.

Mulhall provides a synopsis of Taylor’s contributions to the 1980’s liberalism-communitarianism debate. Unlike so many others, Mulhall correctly reads Taylor’s supposed communitarian critique of liberalism as an attempt to situate liberalism within the moral horizon of modernity that he articulates in Sources of the Self and essays associated with it. Playing off arguments Taylor makes in his 1987 essay “Cross-Purposes: The Liberal - Communitarian Debate” as well as his 1979 piece “What’s Wrong with Negative Liberty,” Mulhall primarily focuses on Taylor’s critique of his former teacher, Berlin, as well as of Nozick’s libertarianism. Mulhall also glosses over the role of Continental philosophy and Canadian politics play in Taylor’s political thought. Though the piece is primarily exegetical, Mulhall does raise one interesting critical question for Taylor, that an adequate theory of liberalism, it appears on Taylor’s reading, must somehow be open to the possibility that the underlying ontology of values that empower it “will be most fruitfully formulable in theistic terms” (p.125). This question is a bit unfair because Taylor repeatedly stresses the point that modern Western democracies must necessarily be secular. Yet there is a constant tension especially in Taylor’s more recent writings between his awareness of the partiality of his faith and his yearning to advocate on behalf of it.

Fergus Kerr and William Connolly, who along with Elshtain and Terry Pinkard concern themselves with Taylor the chronicler of life in a secular age, also pick up on this tension. Focusing primarily on the moral ontology of modernity Taylor outlines in Sources, Kerr shows how this ontological argument is itself predicated upon Taylor’s own brand of moral realism developed first in Explanation of Behavior and later in his reading of Heidegger. Kerr rightly illuminates the tension in Taylor’s work between his pointing to the need for a non -anthropocentric source for moral motivation and the feeling readers often get that the only adequate one is something akin to Taylor’s own theism. Kerr claims that Taylor never gets around to discussing moral dilemmas in any detail (p.102). This isn’t true;Taylor devotes considerable space to explicating such dilemmas in works like Ethics of Authenticity (1995) and . Catholic Modernity? (1999).

Connolly’s essay is as much about himself and clarifying his own thoughts on secularism and how it contrasts with Taylor as it is about Taylor. Evincing his own sense of agonistic respect for Taylor, Connolly does an excellent job clarifying the myriad of disagreements between them. The issues that Connolly raises are much too complex to fully explore here, and readers who are interested should consult Connolly two most recent book, Why I Am Not A Secularist (Minnesota; 1999) and Neuropolitics (Minnesota, 2003) as well as Taylor’s Varieties of Religion Revisited (Oxford; 2002) Modern Social Imaginaries (Duke; 2004) and the aforementioned . Catholic Modernity? I will briefly note that Connolly here as elsewhere rightly alludes to Taylor’s unduly harsh readings of Nietzsche and Foucault. Yet against Connolly and the secularist ethos of deep pluralism that he alludes to here, Taylor could justifiably argue that Connolly is himself unduly restrictive in his understanding of the hold certain values have over non-secular individuals like Taylor.

Elshtain goes in a different theistic direction than Kerr, Mulhall and Connolly. She plays on Taylor’s theory of recognition to engage in an interesting dialogue with him about the dilemma between toleration and proselytization. She notes that real toleration does itself generate a feeling of discomfort similar to what we feel when we are exposed to those attempting to assert their faith, which for many feels like (indeed is) proselytizing. Taylor, on her accurate reading, allows for deep toleration (a sense of toleration that is pluralistic without being fragmented) in that he allows for the act of proselytizing and the possibility that citizens can be persuaded by voices from what appear to be incommensurable ways of life.

Finally, Pinkard, a fellow Hegel scholar, provides a reading of Taylor’s account of what agency means in the modern age. In particular Pinkard focuses on the Hegelian underpinnings of Taylor’s work as an intellectual historian and how Taylor follows Hegel in resolving Kant’s paradox of being a self-legislating subject who must respond and thus legislate in light of a moment of reason that cannot be strictly self-imposed (i.e. the self must respond to some extra-subjective moral force on non-self-imposed norms, p.204). Taylor responds to this by distinguishing three frontiers for moral reasoning (what Taylor calls moral sources): those that flow from the agent himself, those that flow from the natural or expressivist world and those which flow from a theistic source. Taylor thus appears as a sober intellectual realist who strikes a middle ground between the naturalistic boosters of modern moral reasoning (Kantians and company) and the post-romantic pessimists, focusing on what has been lost in the modern story (presumably including folks like Macintyre). Pinkard’s narrative is quite accurate but he omits a discussion of how Taylor attempts to be the great reconciler of these three strands (see Sources of the Self p.107 & 495). A discussion of this Hegelian moment within Taylor’s work would yield a much more complex picture of Taylor’s understanding of the modern identity.

One general criticism of the book is the repeatedly reverential nature of the chapters. Each essay goes out of its way to praise Taylor over and over again while often minimizing points of disagreement. Taylor, as even readers unfamiliar with his work soon realize, is a giant in contemporary philosophy. However what makes his work so interesting is not simply the genius of the positions he has crafted but how his development of these positions illuminates for his readers some of the more trenchant ethical tensions within our contemporary social imaginary. A little more critical work in the volume would have helped to better dramatize these tensions to the non-specialist. This point aside, the book is a fine collection that will prove valuable to all levels of students of contemporary philosophy.