Child Psychology and Pedagogy: The Sorbonne Lectures 1949-1952

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Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Child Psychology and Pedagogy: The Sorbonne Lectures 1949-1952, Talia Welsh (tr.), Northwestern University Press, 2010, 528pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810126169.

Reviewed by Shaun Gallagher, University of Memphis


What happens when a philosopher, well versed in both the philosophy and psychology of his time, but thinking well ahead of his time, is charged with lecturing on the themes of child psychology and pedagogy? If the philosopher is Merleau-Ponty, then the answer is the Sorbonne Lectures of 1949-1952. These lecture notes were published in various editions in Paris (first running along with the course, then as a complete edition in 1964, then again in 1988 and 2001). Talia Welsh translates the complete lectures into English for the first time (eight courses, three of which were previously published in translation). The lectures are in fact a set of lecture notes recorded by students and approved by Merleau-Ponty for publication in the Bulletin de psychologie at the University of Paris.

Welsh provides a helpful Translator's Introduction to what is clearly a volume that will be of interest primarily to Merleau-Ponty scholars. In this respect, however, she misses the opportunity to follow Merleau-Ponty's own emphasis on the importance of situation. The reader would welcome some indication of how these lectures fit into the trajectory of Merleau-Ponty's work since they come at an important time of transition from his earlier focus on phenomenology and psychology in The Structure of Behavior (1942) and Phenomenology of Perception (1945) to his later concerns about language and ontology in Signs (1960) and the posthumous The Visible and the Invisible.  Admittedly, however, this itself could be the subject of a separate volume.

The lectures are wide ranging and reflect a tension between what Merleau-Ponty was required to cover as the course of study (a set of texts which enabled students to pass an exam) and his own thinking about some of the topics. As Welsh notes in her Introduction, Merleau-Ponty refers to hundreds of texts (full references for which she provides), and often seems simply to summarize their content. Yet Merleau-Ponty is clearly marking preferred paths that cut through this material. One, highlighted by Welsh, is a preference for interdisciplinary integration. Merleau-Ponty does not map out a narrow route bounded by variations in psychology and psychoanalysis (e.g., Wallon, Piaget, Lacan, Gestalt psychology), but a more complicated landscape of psychology informed by sociology (Lévi-Bruhl, Lévi-Strauss, Mead), philosophy and phenomenology, with references to Hegel, Marx, Husserl, and many others. In the first set of lectures he explains: "there will be no difference between psychology and philosophy. Psychology is always an implicit, beginning philosophy and philosophy has never finished its contact with facts" (p. 7). Throughout his considerations of developmental psychology and pedagogy, Merleau-Ponty imports insights that point to the social, cultural, and historical dimensions of intersubjectivity and challenge the received psychological doctrines of his times.

Since these are student notes that attempt to reconstruct the lectures, the impression is often that we are reading a summary of Merleau-Ponty's summary of a particular text. On the one hand, this makes it sometimes difficult to discern his own thinking on a particular subject. On the other hand, when he does start to speak in his own voice, his view is fully contextualized in terms of the thinkers and texts with which he is dealing. For example, in the first course he discusses language acquisition, imitation, and the problem of intersubjectivity, outlining various theories and reviewing first Husserl's and then Scheler's solutions to the problem of intersubjectivity. Suggesting that both solutions are inadequate, Merleau-Ponty contends that if we interpose the idea that such self-other relations are always situated (the notion of situation not being adequately considered by Husserl or Scheler), we get a solution that leads us to a reconceptualization of language acquisition and motivation for the child to speak. "To live in an environment is, for the child, the incentive to recapture language and thought to make them his own. Thus, acquisition no longer resembles deciphering a text for which one would possess the code and key" (p. 33).

I think we can see the philosopher at work here. He lets himself be led into various corners by the authors he is considering; he then finds his way out of these corners and into his own conceptual space. He arrives, perhaps, where he might not have arrived without this working through the other's thoughts. In this respect, what he says about the problem of intersubjectivity and language applies equally to the philosophical process. Philosophy is in some way a kind of language acquisition -- not in the simple sense of picking up a vocabulary, but in the sense of being guided along by the language that others have used, and then formulating an expression of something that goes beyond that. As Merleau-Ponty sometimes puts it, the child does not acquire language so much as language acquires the child. The same can be said of the philosopher and ideas.

In regard to language acquisition Merleau-Ponty develops a critique of Piaget, who started as professor of child psychology at the Sorbonne just as Merleau-Ponty was ending his lectures there in preparation for his move across the street to the Collège de France. Instead of drawing a strict line between egocentric, non-communicative language use in the child and communicative language in the adult, Merleau-Ponty, referencing Saussure, argues that egocentric and communicative aspects are to be found in both child and adult (p. 39). Piaget is misled by the limitations of his own experiments. More generally, Piaget sets up the problem based on the wrong assumption, namely, that adult language use should be the measure for evaluating the child's language use. The child, of course, doesn't measure up and everything positive about the child's language is judged to be negative.

In this first course Merleau-Ponty goes on to review topics in linguistics and the various pathologies related to language (e.g., verbal hallucination, aphasia). The primacy of speech (parole) over the stock of language (langue) is a consistent theme. Although he uses Saussure to develop a criticism of Piaget, he also offers critical comments on Saussure, but then in a philosophical flourish at the end of the course he employs the insights he learns from Saussure against Hegel to emphasize elements of contingency against system in the conception of history.

In the other courses Merleau-Ponty covers issues related to pedagogy and developmental stages (he situates these topics in the contexts of psychoanalysis, Marxism, and American culturalism, and ends with an interesting discussion of psychodrama and sociodrama), perception in childhood, children's drawings, the passage to intelligence, and the understanding of others (with further discussions of Piaget, Gestalt psychology, psychoanalysis, and the relevance of sociology and anthropology). In the sixth course he shifts away from developmental issues and discusses the relation between phenomenology and psychology. In the seventh course he returns to child psychology and covers much of the same ground as found in the first five courses, this time with a critical view in regard to methodology, different approaches, and how we should interpret the science.

In the final set of lectures he returns to focus on intersubjectivity or the experience of others, and he ends up on the topic with which he began the first course, language. Here he reviews different conceptions of the problem of intersubjectivity and considers its relation to the problem of object perception (pointing to what are now called enactive aspects of action, as well as back to the Heideggerian analysis of the Zuhanden).  He then discusses several sets of experiments focused on gesture and facial recognition. In an interesting twist, he considers the relevance of theatrical acting to our understanding of others, concluding with remarks about the importance of structure, which he interprets in terms of embodied comportment and what in other works he calls 'intercorporeity', where "my body and the other's form a system" (452). "What I learn to consider as the other's body is a possibility of movements for me" (453). This idea foreshadows recent discussions of enactive approaches to social cognition and is a good example of where Merleau-Ponty is thinking well ahead of his time; or where recent discussions are just starting to catch up with his ideas.

There is a vast amount of material covered in these lectures. Yet, even though they reflect the general lines of Merleau-Ponty's thought, there never seems to be enough of his thought on any one topic to grab hold of with both hands -- his more systematic thoughts are constantly slipping through the reader's fingers. Reading these lecture notes in a productive way requires a one-handed method: holding the lectures in one hand (or at least at hand) as you study Merleau-Ponty's other works.