Chinese and Buddhist Philosophy in Early Twentieth-Century German Thought

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Eric Nelson, Chinese and Buddhist Philosophy in Early Twentieth-Century German Thought, Bloomsbury, 2017, 344 pp., $114.00, ISBN 9781350002555.

Reviewed by Kwok-ying Lau, The Chinese University of Hong Kong


In our present age of globalization, more and more people identify themselves as global citizens. To them, intercultural experience seems evident. Yet intercultural encounter in philosophy is still not yet a widely shared experience. This is particularly true in the West, where teaching and research in philosophy are organized basically in the same institutional setting as a century ago in which non-Western philosophies can hardly find their place. Seen in this context, Eric Nelson's book has the great merit of drawing our attention to the experiences of some great forerunners in intercultural philosophy in Weimar Germany from the end of World War I to the rise of National Socialism in 1933. Nelson's book is not merely a work on some historical episodes of intercultural philosophy but also a work showing the how of intercultural philosophy in itself.

The phrase "intercultural philosophy" is used expressly in order to demarcate it from "comparative philosophy", a mode of philosophy which limits itself to a sort of parallelism or flat juxtaposition of philosophical ideas or doctrines of different cultural traditions without any critical engagement among these doctrines or ideas. Intercultural philosophy conducts dialogues but also mutual criticism with respect to concepts or approaches from different philosophical traditions in view of tackling difficulties unlikely to be resolved within the thinking resources of a single tradition. It is thus a to-and-fro movement of philosophical thinking which dares leaving the comfort zone of one's habitual cultural identity and risks immersing oneself in the heart of cultural otherness instead of remaining at the exterior of the juxtaposed doctrines. This mode of philosophical practice has an aim: to attain self-transformation through possibly losing some parts of the habitual cultural self while gaining new ingredients from cultural alterity, with the effect of grafting upon oneself a new cultural flesh, or at least part of it, to enhance one's own cultural sensibility.[1]

The emergence of intercultural philosophy in Weimar Germany has its precise historical and philosophical context. The social and spiritual crisis in the aftermath of Germany's defeat in the First World War, the bankruptcy of the philosophical rationalism founded by German idealism, and the consciousness of crisis of European humanity all conjoined to motivate, if not the entire German philosophical community, at least a large number of German philosophers of different tendencies, to look for new thinking resources in non-European cultural traditions. This was a difficult and risky task. There was a need of a new philosophy of life and spirituality that the overwhelmingly intellectualist approach of the European philosophical tradition could not provide. So they looked for spiritual and philosophical resources in the Indian and Chinese traditions. What these Weimar German philosophers were trying to do was nothing entirely new. They had their own forerunners: their great eighteenth century ancestors Leibniz and Wolff had looked into Chinese spiritual resources, the I-Ching (or Yijing) and Confucianism, to build, respectively, a system of universal language and a non-theologically oriented moral philosophy. The Weimar philosophers possessed an advantage in comparison to Leibniz and Wolff: the appearance of German translations of Buddhist, Confucian and Daoist classics such as the Yijing, the Analects, the Laozi and the Zhuangzi (in which the great Sinologist and translator Richard Wilhelm, 1873-1930, had played a significant role).

Nelson's book contains a very rich and detailed reconstruction of the intercultural openings undertaken by German philosophers. Some are more well-known, such as Hegel's and Weber's negative attitude toward Confucian China and the positive retrieval of Confucius by Buber, Misch and Jaspers (Chapter 1); Buber and Heidegger's usage of Daoism in their critical explication of Western technological modernity (Chapter 4); and Buber's encounter with Zen Buddhism (Chapter 7). Some others are less well-known, such as the treatment of the problem of resentment and ressentiment in Nietzsche, Scheler and Confucian ethics (Chapter 3), as well as Husserl and Heidegger's encounter with Buddhism (Chapters 6 and 8).

Yet one of the most surprisingly interesting chapters is the one devoted to the detailed account of the active cooperation between the relatively young Chinese philosopher and political thinker Zhang Junmai (known to the West as Carsun Chang, 1886-1969) and the older German philosophers Rudolf Eucken (1846-1926) and Hans Driesch (1867-1949) (Chapter 2). Zhang visited Europe from 1918 to 1920 and met Eucken in his home in Jena and eventually stayed there during fourth months to co-author with Eucken the book Das Lebensproblem in China und Europa ("The Problem of Life in China and Europe") (Leipzig, 1922). Both authors acknowledge the heritage of German idealism in its practical aspects: it is the philosophical basis of a movement of ethical activism which can be a great source of cultural renewal. Yet, after WWI, Europeans were disoriented by structural conflicts and crises. At this cultural crossroad, they were aware of the need to learn the ethical clarity, simplicity, and sincerity of Confucian philosophy, which indicate an ethical height and nobility of spirit which were absent in both the atheistic utilitarianism of Western modernity and the ossified traditions and dogmas of Christian theological thinking. According to Nelson, Eucken and Zhang contend that "China continues to be a source for furthering practical moral-political Enlightenment in the West just as it was a paradigm in early modernity for Leibniz and Wolff." (p. 50) In their book, after the historical parts devoted to an overview of the history of Western philosophy and Chinese ethics, the third part undertakes diagnostic reflections on the contemporary ethical-social situation in China and Europe. To Nelson, Eucken and Zhang's book remains an exemplary work in intercultural philosophy in its endeavour to bring together critically different philosophical perspectives to address contemporary philosophical and practical issues. (p. 50)

Upon Zhang's return to China, he organized the visit of the German intellectual couple Hans and Margarete Driesch in Republican China during nine months in 1922-23. After their return to Germany, the Driesch couple published their observations and reflections on Chinese and Western culture in Fern-Ost als gäst Jungchinas ("The Far-East as Guest of Young China") (Leipzig, 1925), a book partly based on their lectures given in Beijing. In this book, Hans and Margarete Driesch defend their cosmopolitanism and their faith in cultural universalism against the rising wave of militarism and nationalism. They believe that there is no difference in essence between Eastern and Western peoples. The history of human civilization shows that different cultures always learn from one another through the recognition of the others' merits and one's own faults, as recommended by the Confucian code of learning. Thus there is already a history of intercultural exchange which shows that there is no incomprehensible abyss between Eastern and Western forms of thinking and living. According to Driesch, if the West occupies a currently superior position to the East, it is not due to some intrinsic essence of the West, but to its cultivation of education and Bildung and the critical consciousness unfolded in modern critical philosophy. Yet Driesch believes that there is a new emerging culture in China which is not merely an appropriation of Western theories and practices but also an adaptation and reinterpretation of Chinese traditions, in particular Confucian ethics, that is superior to Western morality in many ways. In his final Beijing lecture, Driesch expressed his faith, a bit naïvely optimistic, in the joint cooperation of the European and Chinese intellectual traditions to prepare the way for a greater human community in the form of one unified democratic and pan-ecumenical international state. To Nelson, the exchanges between Zhang and Driesch constitute a suggestive exemplar for intercultural philosophy and hermeneutics, in that the latter shows "an openness to encountering and learning from the other". (p. 61)

Almost all the Weimar philosophers studied by Nelson emphasize the necessity and possibility of appropriation or re-appropriation of Chinese or Asian thought in general. They do this according to their various degrees of knowledge of Eastern philosophies in order to remedy the insufficiencies of Western philosophy. But major philosophers such as Husserl and Heidegger are still unable to entirely get rid of their Eurocentric conception of philosophy.

Nelson does not present a purely historical work; he also has the ambition of working toward an intercultural hermeneutics with critical intent. For example in Chapter 3, on the basis of the reconstruction of the confrontation between Nietzsche, Scheler and Confucius on the problem of resentment and ressentiment, Nelson further proposes the outline of a critical intercultural Confucian ethics. Reconstructing the argumentation embedded in the Analects and the Mencius, Nelson maintains that early Confucian philosophy provides the reason for the resentfulness of the common people. It arises when either coercion and force or power and wealth are abused. Thus, to Confucian thinkers "the resentment of the common people against elites is ethically less blameworthy and politically less problematic than the arrogance, enmity, and resentment of elites against non-elites." (p. 107) Yet the resentment of elites against non-elites "is evident in contemporary political discourses concerning the distribution of wealth and power that tend to blame the poor, the weak, and the voiceless for their conditions." (p. 107) For this reason, Nelson believes that the Confucian approach to resentment has critical import for contemporary ethical and political reflections, of which Nietzsche's conception of ressentiment fails to give an adequate account. Since Confucian ethics contains both elements of an ethics of self-cultivation and elements of an asymmetric ethics of priority of the other over the self, the two-dimensionality of Confucian ethics is well-equipped to construct an ethics of alterity in the era of cultural pluralism. It is in this sense that Confucianism provides the ingredients for a critical intercultural ethics that European philosophers are unable to conceive.

For Nelson, the need for an intercultural hermeneutics corresponds to the need for a more adequate historical model that can critically engage the hermeneutical situation of the historical thinkers under consideration, and our own hermeneutical situation as well. An intercultural hermeneutics has "need of a [more] adequate and appropriate model of the relationship between the universal and the particular, and the normative and the historical, than is evident in the writings of the philosophers considered above" (p. 40) To Nelson, a "critical intercultural Confucianism" can take up this role. This is because the elements of "mutuality, reciprocity, and reversibility" necessary for an intercultural hermeneutics are "discernible in the elementary Confucian principle of shu (恕)that is an ethical and interpretative task -- with a trans- and intercultural import -- to practice as a guiding idea in relation to others." (p. 40)

With this task in mind, Nelson does not underestimate the difficulties and the dilemmas of intercultural philosophy, which consist of

either (1) presupposing the primacy of one discourse in order to interpret others, often precluding critical reflection on itself and genuine dialogue with the other, or (2) a relativistic multiplicity that entails the abandonment of reflection, critique, and argumentation between discourses that allows for the evaluation and rejection of divergent and competing claims. (p. 41)

This is the dilemma between monistic universalism from the above and a banal non-critical pluralism which amounts to flat relativism.

Yet Nelson is careful enough to point out a false dilemma among those who in the West insist that the Eastern mind is an entirely incomprehensible "wholly other", because they ratiocinate between "either identity and comprehensibility or alterity and ineffability". (p. 198) Such an attitude of ratiocination originates from the belief that there is philosophical understanding only when there is complete understanding. But Nelson reminds us that the art of intercultural hermeneutics as an interpretative task is not a game of all or nothing: between complete comprehensibility and complete incomprehensibility, misinterpretation always comes into play. Thus misinterpretation "is not the exception but the ordinary condition of communication, such that understanding must be pursued and cultivated to be achieved." (p. 199) One may hold the hypothetical view that the exchange between "Eastern" and "Western" discourses was predominantly a history of misinterpretation. But we must not overlook the fact that "Eastern and Western thinkers and texts were and are already . . . interculturally and intertextually intertwined." (p. 199) This is the hermeneutical situation that we must acknowledge.

Considered from such a hermeneutical situation, Nelson is particularly tolerant with regard to "the multiple non-trivial Eurocentric moments" in the two great German phenomenological philosophers Husserl and Heidegger, and tries to convince the reader that "phenomenology ought not to be interpreted as intrinsically Eurocentric". (p. 199) We completely agree with this observation, as we have arrived at more or less the same conclusion based on different analyses.[2] Of course, intercultural philosophy cannot be satisfied with flat uncritical relativism. The question of universals remains: how can a concept born within a determinate culture overcome its particularity and ascend to the status of universal? Nelson is fully aware of the necessity of posing this problem, but seems to let it remain open. We believe we have found the beginning of an answer in the concept of "lateral universals" proposed by Merleau-Ponty.[3] But this new conception of universals engages a conception of reason which is no longer the pure reason of intellectualism, but incarnate or "fleshy" reason as conceived by Merleau-Ponty. The fact that Nelson begins his Conclusion by bringing in Merleau-Ponty's critical engagement with Hegel's conception of philosophical rationality as an immanent system shows perhaps that he is aware that the solution of the problem has to be sought also from philosophers beyond the geographical and spiritual boundary of Germany.

[1] For further explications of the concept of cultural flesh, see Kwok-ying Lau, Phenomenology and Intercultural Understanding: Toward a New Cultural Flesh (Springer, 2016), 15-19, 190-191, 196-229.

[2] Lau, Phenomenology and Intercultural Understanding, 3-9.

[3] Lau, Phenomenology and Intercultural Understanding, 167-168.