Chinese Philosophy in an Era of Globalization

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Wang, Robin R. (ed.), Chinese Philosophy in an Era of Globalization, SUNY Press, 2004, 256pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791460061.

Reviewed by Yang Xiao, Kenyon College



The editor of this splendid volume, Robin Wang, has hit upon the great idea of inviting American philosophers to respond to their Chinese colleagues’ work. Six influential papers and book chapters published in Chinese in the 1980s and 90s are expertly translated into English; they then are commented on by six American philosophers. The book covers a broad range of topics and is divided into two parts. The first consists of three leading Chinese scholars’ pieces on issues in the history of Chinese philosophy and religion: the theory of value in pre-modern China, the concepts of mind and nature in Zhu Xi (one of the most important Confucian philosophers), and polytheism in early China. They are commented on by two leading American scholars in Chinese philosophy, Kwong-loi Shun and Bryan W. Van Norden, and a philosopher of religion, Stephen Davis. The second part consists of three comparative studies: Heidegger’s and Lao-Zhuang’s views on language, Alvin Plantinga’s and Zhuangzi’s views on knowledge, and Aristotelian and Confucian virtue ethics. Merold Westphal responds to the piece on Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang (Laozi and Zhuangzi). Alvin Plantinga and Alasdair MacIntyre respond to the other two pieces respectively.

It is not easy to do justice to such an array of thinkers in a brief review. This is comparative philosophy at its best, for the format of dialogue allows for deeper agreements and disagreements to surface and confrontational questions to be raised. Here I shall summarize the main points of each pair of essays and focus on those in which the disagreements open up new topics for future dialogues. When we read all the pieces together, some important common themes start to emerge. One major theme is the issue of whether it is legitimate to interpret Chinese philosophy in modern Western terms, i.e., terms outside of its own tradition. We may call this the question of hermeneutic legitimacy, which is a central issue in comparative philosophy. One may think that the question inevitably arises because we now live in an era of globalization, as Wang suggests in the title of the book. But I believe there are deeper reasons. What MacIntyre says about ethics applies equally to philosophy in general: “All reflective ethics needs to develop, whether explicitly or implicitly, a comparative dimension” (152). In other words, it is impossible to do reflective philosophy, be it Chinese or Western, without in some way doing comparative philosophy.

It is fitting that the editor starts the volume with Zhang Dainian and Kwong-loi Shun’s dialogue on value theory in pre-modern China, because the dialogue focuses on the hermeneutic legitimacy question that keeps recurring throughout the rest of the book. Zhang’s 1936 book Key Concepts in Chinese Philosophy represents one of the first efforts to use Western concepts to re-organize traditional Chinese metaphysics, cosmology, and epistemology (its English translation was published by Yale University Press in 2002). Years later, in the 1980s, Zhang wrote a series of papers spelling out his re-interpretation of pre-modern Chinese ethics in terms of theories of value. The piece included here is from this series. I shall mention his two major theses. The first is his semantic thesis that the term gui in pre-modern China means “value” (jiazhi). The second is his substantive philosophical thesis that thinkers in pre-modern China have different theories of value in the sense that they have different ideas about the standards of value and how to rank different types of values. For example, Confucius and Mencius, according to Zhang, take moral virtues as having the highest value, and assign a much lower value to utility and profit, whereas Mozi turns the Confucian hierarchy of values up side down, ranking utility as the highest. This view of Chinese ethics, as well as Zhang’s general approach of applying Western concepts to Chinese philosophy, has prevailed among Chinese scholars throughout the latter stages of the 20th century and down until the present day.

In Shun’s response, some refreshing cold water is thrown on this practice. Here we see the methodologically sophisticated sensibility that’s already in display in Shun’s important 1999 book on Mencius. Shun challenges a fundamental presupposition of Zhang’s paper by asking whether the concept of value can be legitimately applied to pre-modern Chinese thinkers at all. Shun’s question raises one’s awareness of the legitimacy question and forces one to argue for one’s hermeneutic practice explicitly; one does not have to agree with Shun’s answer to appreciate it. Shun rejects both of Zhang’s theses by arguing that, first, “while early thinkers do use gui to steer their audience to a conception of what they regard as truly of high status, gui does not function in any way close to the modern term ’value’ (jiazhi)” (41), and second, “it is very unlikely that pre-modern Chinese thinkers are concerned with theories of value in Zhang’s sense” (39).

I think Shun is right to reject some parts of Zhang’s theses. For instance, Shun shows very convincingly that, in the case of certain passages in the Mencius, Zhang’s reading of them in terms of value theory is a distortion of what is really going on in the text. However, Shun might have overstated his conclusion. I believe that in the case of the Mozi the textual evidence actually supports Zhang’s claim that Mozi has a utilitarian theory of value. But I agree with Shun that Zhang does not get the difference between Mencius and Mozi quite right. The difference is not that they have inverted hierarchies of values; their disagreement is much more radical. In Mencius 6A16-7, Mencius basically says that moral virtues are “intrinsic values” (liang-gui), which are parts of one’s true self. They can’t be “values” (gui) because values are subject to a person’s arbitrary subjective preferences. This shows that the term “gui” in the Mencius is still used in the sense of subjective preferences (values). In other words, Zhang’s semantic thesis might still be true, even though his philosophical thesis has to be rejected in the case of Mencius. Mencius’ conception of liang-gui should remind us of Charles Taylor’s conception of “strong evaluation,” which he also takes pains to differentiate from “values.” For Confucius and Mencius, another reason why moral virtues (such as benevolence, justice, and ritual propriety) are not “values,” but rather something beyond value, is because they believe that one can give up one’s life for the sake of benevolence (Analects, 15.9) or justice and ritual (Mencius 3B1). Here one might recall Heidegger’s critique of value philosophy and his remark that no one ever dies for “values.” I hope there will be more comparative analysis on this issue.

The interactions in the other two pairs of essays in the first part of the book are not as confrontational as the Zhang-Shun dialogue. Let us first look at the exchange between Chen Lai and Bryan W. Van Norden. Chen’s contribution is a chapter from his 1985 book on Zhu Xi (1130 –1200). This book is still one of the best studies on Zhu Xi, who created one of the most sophisticated and innovative philosophical systems that one can find. In his response, Van Norden does not address the substance of Chen’s exposition of Zhu Xi’s concepts of mind and nature; instead he raises two general questions that are not directly addressed by Chen in the chapter: (1) Does Zhu Xi’s philosophy have anything to offer as a living philosophical position? (2) Does Zhu Xi get Confucius and Mencius right? His answer to (1) is “yes”, and most of Van Norden’s response is devoted to explaining this affirmative answer, which he backs up with compelling arguments. His answer to (2) is “no”. Following the eighteenth-century scholar Dai Zhen, Van Norden argues that the key term li (pattern) in Zhu Xi’s philosophy never occurs in the Analects, and it means something quite different when it appears in the Mencius. He concludes that Zhu Xi’s philosophy is a distortion of Confucius’ and Mencius’ original ideas. I don’t think this is the end of the conversation; I believe that Chen could defend Zhu Xi, for Zhu Xi once responded to a similar question, which Chen has dealt with in his book. But I can’t go into details here.

In his short response to Zhao Dunhua’s paper, Stephen Davis does not directly address Zhao’s thesis that monotheism antedates polytheism in early China, but he raises some important methodological issues, a major one being whether Zhao’s classification scheme (monotheism/henotheism/polytheism) is comprehensive and adequate when applied to the religions in the West. In the spirit of Shun’s questioning, Davis could also have raised the more general legitimacy question of whether these Western terms are applicable to the religions in China.

As one might expect, this question of hermeneutic legitimacy would become even more pressing when we move to the second part of the book, where Chinese and Western philosophers are directly compared in terms that are alien to their own traditions.

Zhang Xianglong’s comparative study of Heidegger’s and Lao-Zhuang’s views of language was first published in 1996; similar arguments can be found in his influential book (in Chinese) on Heidegger and Daoism, which was based on his dissertation at SUNY, Buffalo. He is one of the first Chinese scholars to argue systematically for the affinities between Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang; his work represents some of the best work on comparative philosophy in China. In this paper, he first develops a four-fold scheme to classify different philosophical positions in terms of their attitudes towards the nature of language and ultimate reality; he then argues that Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang occupy the same position in the scheme he describes. First, with regard to the nature of language, there are two possible positions: language is either “conceptual representing” or “pre-conceptual representing.” With regard to the nature of ultimate reality, there are also two possible positions: reality is either a “conceptual entity” or a “non-conceptual entity.” Therefore, with regard to the nature of language and reality, there are four possible combinations of attitudes, the fourth one being that language is “pre-conceptual representing” and reality is a “non-conceptual entity.” Zhang then argues that Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang share the fourth position. For them, language and reality are “prior to concepts, names, and ideas” (210). They are “primordial language and primordial reality” and are not ontologically different from each other (208). Moreover, this “primordial language” is the language that “Dao speaks,” not the language we humans speak. This is why Zhang calls it “dao-language.” Zhang thinks that human language is “conceptual representing,” thus the “super-conceptual” dao-language is beyond the reach of our language that expresses “concepts and objects” (203-4).

Westphal agrees with Zhang’s conclusion that there is a “profound affinity” between Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang: both believe that “we are called by a language which comes to us from beyond the reach of our own language” (221). But Westphal raises some extremely important questions by bringing in the case of Augustine. Augustine also believes in a call that comes from beyond the reach of our own language, but for him, the call comes literally from a personal caller: “the claim that God speaks is a literal claim and not a metaphor. There is a call because there is a caller” (224). However, this is not the case in Heidegger or Lao-Zhuang. For example, when Zhang utters the statement “Dao speaks,” he can only mean it metaphorically. Westphal also offers a stronger, ethical critique: “My question is whether they [Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang] have properly identified the voice that calls. Is it possible that it is the voice of God who is so eminently personal that we can speak literally and not metaphorically about divine speech? And is it possible that such a personal God is love itself and for that reason commands us to love each other in ways that Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang have not clearly heard?” (226).

Here I shall not guess how Zhang would respond to Westphal’s critique; instead I want to raise a question about Zhang’s argument. If we follow the spirit of Shun’s and Davis’s hermeneutic questioning, we should ask whether Zhang’s four-fold scheme is adequate in the first place. It seems that when Zhang talks about regarding language as “conceptual representing,” he does not realize that this is a combination of two attitudes: regarding language as “conceptual” and as “representing.” He seems to assume that if something is conceptual, it must be representational as well. He has thus left out a possible position of taking language as conceptual but not representational. A recent example of this position is Robert Brandom, who argues that human language is always conceptual but not necessarily representational, and that Heidegger holds this view as well. I believe one can also find this view in Donald Davidson and Gadamer. Moreover, both Davidson and Gadamer explicitly emphasize that we should reject the “language and world” dualism, and the corresponding concept of a non-conceptual reality, which is the main source of relativism and skepticism. As many scholars have argued, this is also a point that Heidegger emphasizes. My question is then the following: Since Heidegger and Lao-Zhuang share so many things with Brandom, Davidson, and Gadamer, is it possible that their real position on language is rather that language is conceptual but non-representational? If this is indeed the case, perhaps the so-called “primordial language” or “dao-language” is not some remote and mysterious “original, pure region of language” (210), but our own human language?

Kelly Clark and Liu Zongkun’s project in their paper is to compare Zhuangzi with Plantinga, a philosopher who is very different from Heidegger. Clark and Liu find some surprising structural similarities between their views on knowledge. For example, both Zhuangzi and Plantinga believe that knowledge of reality is not produced by reason or senses, and that there is natural knowledge of reality produced by natural dispositions.

The initially skeptical Plantinga is convinced by Clark and Liu that this is indeed a good comparative project. Plantinga agrees with their reading of his own Reformed epistemology, but he disagrees with their reading of Zhuangzi as non-skeptic, arguing that Zhuangzi holds a limited form of skepticism. He also reiterates his well-known argument that it is rational to believe in the Christian God even though there is no evidence for it and there are other people who disagree with it.

Here I shall not dispute Clark and Liu’s reading of Plantinga. I want to raise a question about the nature of the similarities they claim exist between Zhuangzi and Plantinga. They state their conclusion in the following way: “Although we can’t be certain, both authors maintain that we can grasp enough of the truth, through our natural dispositions, to properly order our lives in accord with the truth. With mirrors polished through the renunciation of self our natural heart/minds reflect the Way” (181). I think they would acknowledge that, even though Zhuangzi’s and Plantinga’s theories of natural knowledge are structurally similar, the contents of the natural knowledge are different for them. For Zhuangzi, it is the belief in Dao, whereas for Plantinga, it’s the belief in God. The question then is: How can a piece of knowledge be “natural” if its content varies from time to time, from person to person, and place to place? We normally call such knowledge “historical” rather than “natural” knowledge. To use the metaphor mentioned above, how can the “polished mirror,” which is supposed to reflect the truth, reflect different things, depending on who is looking into it?

The structural similarities between Zhuangzi’s and Plantinga’s epistemological theories of natural knowledge seem to be quite superficial, because the contents of natural knowledge also appear in their theories. For example, the following is Clark and Liu’s formulation of Zhuangzi’s theory: “the belief in the Dao is a kind of natural knowledge, based on the natural state of human mind under the restorative effects of the Dao” (174). In other words, the natural knowledge of Dao is produced by Dao. Since the term “dao” in the Zhuangzi means “patterns of nature,” Zhuangzi’s theory is really that our knowledge of the patterns of nature is produced by the patterns of nature. In such a “naturalist” theory of knowledge, there seems no room for Plantinga’s Christian God. Zhuangzi’s “naturalism” turns out to be dangerously similar to the kind of naturalism that Plantinga has recently been trying to defeat.

In what sense can we still say that Zhuangzi and Plantinga have similar theories of natural knowledge? Is it possible that Clark and Liu misread Zhuangzi as similar to Plantinga because they assume that “The Dao is Creator” (165), an idea that actually cannot be found in the Zhuangzi? (Westphal and Zhang Xianglong, both believing that dao is not a personal caller like God, should be invited to join the discussion here.) It is one of the great merits of the dialogue between Clark-Liu and Plantinga that issues like this are being discovered, for they shed new light on important aspects of both Zhuangzi and Plantinga.

Wan Junren’s and MacIntyre’s articles are the longest and in some ways the richest in the book. They are well-matched: Wan is the Chinese translator of MacIntyre’s Whose Justice? Which Rationality? and Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry, and MacIntyre might be the only prominent moral philosopher in the West who has written on Confucian ethics and Japanese ethics. For lack of space, I shall only mention one major point in this extremely interesting exchange. Wan’s thesis is that the main difference between Aristotelian ethics and traditional Confucian ethics is that the former has the conception of the individual as the “subject” (132), or a “Western-style ’individual’ bearing rights and constituting its own telos” (130), whereas the latter does not have such a concept: “Confucian ethics clearly lacks the sort of independent, substantial entity called the ’individual’ that we find in Aristotle or Western ethics as a whole” (125). However, Wan does not provide adequate textual evidence to substantiate his claims; for example, the idea that individuals constitute their own teloi can’t possibly be Aristotelian. Wan seems to be reading modern Western individualism and subjectivism into Aristotle’s ethics. He tends to see Western ethics as an unchanging whole; he is then able to put it in sharp contrast with Confucian ethics. This might be why he often uses “Aristotle’s ethics,” “Aristotelian ethics,” and “Western ethics” interchangeably.

In his response, MacIntyre argues that Aristotelianism and Confucianism are somewhat closer than Wan believes. First, he says, “Aristotle’s conception of the moral agent is similarly at odds with such distinctively modern Western conceptions of the individual” (154); second, “the Confucian views seems to be more deeply committed to an account of individuals as having a substantial reality than Professor Wan always recognizes” (154). The first point is a familiar story now, so MacIntyre focuses mainly on the second point. He backs it up with textual evidence, giving a masterful interpretation of certain passages from the Analects. I am convinced that both of his points are true.

If we take this exchange as purely academic, this should settle the issue. However, if we read Wan’s piece in its contemporary Chinese context, we can sense between the lines that there is a deeper concern about the current political situation in China. Wan’s real anxiety seems to be that the Confucian tradition is responsible for the lack of individual human rights in China. So even if Wan accepts MacIntyre’s point that Confucian tradition is “more deeply committed to an account of individuals as having a substantial reality” than he recognizes, this won’t be enough for Wan, because the commitment is not deep enough to produce a conception of individual rights.

This lack of attention to the political context of Chinese philosophy, as well as the surprising absence of any work directly on Chinese political philosophy, might be the only weakness of this fine volume. There has been some really exciting work in political philosophy published in China recently; I hope that there will be a sequel to this volume, bringing Western and Chinese political philosophers into conversations with one another. This book has already set up a terrific model for such projects, and it has indeed fulfilled its promise of opening up “new possibilities for intriguing and meaningful philosophical exchange.”