Chinese Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Haiming Wen, Chinese Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 172pp., $19.99 (pbk), ISBN: 9780521186766.

Reviewed by Jung H. Lee, Northeastern University


Originally published in Chinese as Zhongguo zhexue sixiang 中國哲學思想, Wen Haiming's Chinese Philosophy presents an illustrated introduction to the history of Chinese philosophy from its origins to contemporary developments in China and the West. As a part of Cambridge University Press's "Introductions to Chinese Culture" series, Chinese Philosophy is meant to provide an accessible introduction to the Chinese philosophical tradition through the prism of Western philosophical categories. As the author notes, "I employ Western philosophical categories to describe different issues in Chinese philosophy, so as to provide readers with a clear conception of Chinese philosophical sensibility and the evolution of various schools" (2). Since the intended audience for Chinese Philosophy is the general reader, I will attempt to review the volume in those terms, appraising its merits on how effectively it works as a general introduction to Chinese philosophical thought. I will end with some reflections on Wen's methodological choices as part of a broader discussion on the historiography of Chinese philosophy.

Wen begins Chinese Philosophy by suggesting that the discipline of philosophy is universal, that the "basic philosophical inquiries of Western philosophers, such as social, political, and cosmic problems concerning life and knowledge, are also those of Chinese philosophers" (1). Through the process of answering these "fundamental philosophical problems," Chinese philosophers developed, according to Wen, a "unique Chinese philosophical sensibility." In style and structure,Chinese Philosophy resembles what Richard Rorty once called "doxography," or "the attempt to impose a problematic on a canon drawn up without reference to that problematic, or, conversely, to impose a canon on a problematic constructed without reference to that canon."[1] In the tradition of prior historiographical works like Hu Shi's 胡適 Zhonguo zhexue dagang 中國哲學大綱 and Feng Youlan's 馮友蘭 A History of Chinese Philosophy, Wen attempts to present the Chinese philosophical canon with reference to categories and problematics largely derived from the West. However, unlike some recent introductions to Chinese philosophy (e.g., JeeLoo Liu's An Introduction to Chinese Philosophy and Karyn Lai's An Introduction to Chinese Philosophy) that robustly engage Chinese thinkers through the analytic lens of contemporary Anglo-American philosophy (what Rorty calls "rational reconstruction"), the aspirations of Wen's Chinese Philosophy entail the more modest goal of chronicling what various canonical figures had to say about problems traditionally called philosophical. While this methodological strategy possesses some virtues, especially given Wen's goal of providing the general reader with a "clear conception of Chinese philosophical sensibility," it can also have the unwelcome effect of distorting or decontextualizing the significance of a figure or text, especially given the rather thin historical narrative that accompanies Wen's account.

In the longest and most developed chapter in the book ("Chinese Political Philosophy: Pre-Qin Philosophers"), Wen examines the considered political views of the "Hundred Schools" from the classical period of Chinese intellectual history. Since this chapter is emblematic of the strengths and weaknesses of the volume as a whole, I will attempt to raise more general issues in the discussion of particular points and arguments. Wen does an admirable job of providing concise, clear summaries (along with appropriate illustrations) of figures like Confucius and Han Fei that do not assume any specialized knowledge on the part of the reader. Having said that, there are some aspects of Wen's presentation that give the reader pause. To begin with, Wen at times blurs the distinction between history and legend in his presentation of some of the major figures of the pre-Qin period. For example, he writes about Laozi as if he were an actual historical figure, relating the details of his hagiography and legend as if they were documented historical fact. For a reader unfamiliar with the contested nature of the "legend of Laozi," Wen's discussion may suggest that an historical figure named Laozi existed in time and penned what we now know to be the Daodejing.

On a more substantive level, perhaps due to the concise nature of much of the exposition, many of Wen's arguments (understandably) call out for greater elaboration. For example, Wen writes,

though Confucianism is not a religion in the strict sense, it functions as a kind of religion in the lives of Chinese people . . . This so-called religion finally came to be an inextricable part of Chinese culture after the sustained efforts of many generations of Confucianists. (25-6).

He does not go on to explain what he means by "religion" in this context (not just in the "strict" sense but in any sense at all) and glosses over the fact that the distinction between "philosophy" and "religion" is a Western distinction that does not correspond neatly to anything in the ancient Chinese imagination. It may have behooved Wen to delineate some of the foundational cosmological and metaphysical beliefs of the ancient Chinese at the beginning of the volume (rather than at the end in an appendix) to conceptually orient the general reader to the variations in terminology that we inevitably discover in the Chinese worldview.

To take another example of a statement that needs clarification, Wen writes in the section on Laozi, "Laozi's thinking through opposition shows he is more profound than Confucius in some respects" (40). Again, it is unclear why "thinking through opposition" is inherently "more profound" than Confucius' way of (less oppositional?) thinking or even what "oppositional" means in this context. I think some of the vagueness and confusion in parts of the narrative could have been avoided in large measure had Wen chosen to quote the original sources directly and in greater length. More often than not, Wen chooses to paraphrase the passage or anecdote in question (e.g., on page 44 he writes, "Laozi's ideal way of ruling is to keep the populace uninformed"), so the reader is completely dependent on Wen's summaries to discern the meaning of the idea or concept.

The chapter on pre-Qin thinkers also highlights some of the difficulties mentioned earlier in regard to the fittingness of Wen's organizing categories in regard to the texts and figures examined. Although many pre-Qin thinkers address issues of statecraft and rulership, it would be difficult to identify many texts as exclusively works of political philosophy (some like Yang Zhu 楊朱 do not address politics at all). Rather, the great majority of "masters" (zhuzi 諸子) tend to address issues related to government and rulership as part of an overall intellectual framework that also includes ethics, the arts, cosmology, social decorum, education, and self-cultivation.[2] To take a case in point, it is difficult to categorize the Zhuangzi as a piece of political philosophy unless one considers certain sections of the text (i.e., the so-called "Primitivist Chapters" and "Syncretist Chapters") in isolation. Even then, one could argue that the political dimensions of those sections can only be appreciated if one has an understanding of the unique cosmology and attendant ideas of self-cultivation at the heart of early Daoist thought. This is probably why Wen is compelled to write cryptic things like the following in regard to the political philosophy of the Zhuangzi:

The Zhuangzi is a book that teaches people to not take themselves too seriously so they may extricate themselves from the struggle of power . . . Zhuangzi realizes that humans are most confined by the unavoidable presence of body. Thus, Zhuangzi brings forth his ontology of making things equal and "living without self" as his method of being free from real political structure. (48, 50)

The Foucaultian and Nietzschean overtones betray the inelegance of describing the Zhuangzi through the prism of political philosophy. If anything, one could make the argument that it is ethics or moral philosophy that animates the "Hundred Schools" of the classical period even for thinkers like Mencius and Mozi who centrally address concerns in the political realm.

The potential problems of applying Western philosophical categories to Chinese philosophical thought are more pronounced in the next two chapters where Wen attempts to organize thinkers from the Han to Tang Dynasties around metaphysics and thinkers from the Song to Ming Dynasties around epistemology. Again, although there are examples of certain thinkers (e.g., Guo Xiang 郭象, Wang Bi 王弼) from the Han to the Tang who undoubtedly addressed issues and questions identifiable with traditional Western metaphysics, the heading seems awkwardly suited in regard to many thinkers highlighted by Wen. For example, in the section on Dong Zhongshu, Wen dedicates much of the discussion to Dong's "personification of Tian as man's great-grandfather":

Dong Zhongshu provides heaven with a human face and considers it the great-grandfather of mankind. In this way, the continuity of heaven and human beings is colored with an intimate sensibility, and the changes of the dao of tian are closely correlated with those of human affairs (70).

What Wen fails to mention is how Dong's cosmology serves the broader rationale for imperial sovereignty and Confucian rulership, essentially deriving political norms from macrocosmic and microcosmic models. In the tradition of Lu Jia 陸賈 and Jia Yi 賈誼, Dong attempts to discredit Qin models of imperial sovereignty by invoking ideals rooted in the Confucian canon, especially the Spring and Autumn Annals (Chunqiu 春 秋), and cosmological theories current during his time (e.g., Yin-Yang and Five Phases School 陰陽, 五行家) as well as non-Confucian models of rulership (e.g., Daoist). By focusing the discussion exclusively on Dong's metaphysical views, Wen loses sight of how Dong's cosmology informs his considered views on Confucian ideals of rulership. On a different note, it is surprising that in a chapter that includes the introduction and early development of Buddhism in China, no space is given to the emergence of Daoist religion, especially since many early texts (e.g., Taiping jing 太平經) do in fact engage issues in cosmology and metaphysics.

In the next chapter, Wen suggests that "the major contribution of Song-Ming philosophers is epistemology," or rather, a "unique systematic epistemology with Chinese sensibility" (105). To illustrate, Wen offers the example of Zhou Dunyi. Wen describes Zhou's epistemology in the following way:

The Taiji [great ultimate] and Wuji [the ultimateless] are continuous and encompass one another. It is through the being of Taiji that the nothingness of Wuji is able to be perceived and concretized. When Taiji moves, yang generates, and its quiescence comes after yang reaches its peak. In the Diagram of the Great Ultimateyangqi and yingqi mutually comprise each other and alternate to be one another. Each one of them relies on its counterpart to exist. The resonance and alternation between yin and yang generates the myriad things. (109)

We cannot read this passage as a piece of "epistemology" unless we are prepared to expand the notion, perhaps to the point of meaninglessness. Again, Wen may have been better served by refraining from using these organizing categories and merely characterizing each thinker in his or her own terms. If the reader is familiar at all with standard definitions of categories like epistemology in Western philosophical discourse, she may be confused by the unorthodox ways in which they are employed by Wen. Of course, the categories can be expanded to accommodate different cultures and times, but there needs to be at least a prima facie justification or rationale for why we should read someone like Zhou Dunyi as an epistemologist when this is not the way that he describes his own work or even how other thinkers (e.g., Zhu Xi, the Cheng brothers) in his own tradition describe it.

Since Wen ends Chinese Philosophy with chapters on the modern development of Chinese philosophy, I will conclude this review with some methodological and metaphilosophical reflections on Chinese philosophy and its relationship with Western philosophy. Wen begins the penultimate chapter by making the following argument:

The question of whether Chinese philosophy is "philosophy" has long haunted researchers in modern China. I would argue that there was "philosophy" in ancient China, though it was not as exactly the same as "philosophy" in the West. Ancient Chinese philosophers had a profound philosophical sensibility and conducted theoretical debates about it. This can be compared to the history of Western philosophy. The classification of Chinese thought is disputed because ancient thinkers lacked understanding of Western philosophy, and they were not cognizant of their own philosophical sensibility. For this reason, researchers today do not recognize ancient Chinese sensibility as "philosophy." (131)

This is a very strong version of what Carine Defoort has called the "Chinese philosophy exists" position, or the notion that the word "philosophy" is "simply the Western term for the discussions and speculations of, by and large, the traditional 'masters', despite cultural variations."[3] It is Wen's belief that thinkers as varied as Sunzi 孫子, Xuanzang 玄奘, and Wang Yangming 王陽明 all engaged in the practice of something called "philosophy," even though none of the three recognized himself or the work he was doing as "philosophy." The question here is: "does the imposition of modern Western conceptual categories on non-Western patterns of thought and modes of discourse with different categories promote or hinder understanding of them?"[4]

As a matter of historical record, we know that the term for "philosophy" in Chinese -- zhexue 哲學 -- was originally introduced by the Meiji thinker, Nishi Amane(1829-1887), who coined the neologism tetsugaku in Japanese as a translation of the Western term. Prior to that time, no one in China (or East Asia more broadly) referred to the work of traditional "masters" (zhuzi 諸子) as "philosophy." Now, as Bryan Van Norden has suggested recently, we can make conceptual comparisons between cultures even if one of the cultures lacks the exact lexical equivalent of the original term.[5] Thus, even though there is no exact equivalent in classical Chinese to the Greek term "ἀρετή," we can say that thinkers like Mencius were conversant with notions of virtue and excellence. Or, to take a diachronic example from Chinese intellectual history, although figures like Zhuangzi and the authors of the Laozi did not refer to themselves as "Daoists," we can retrospectively classify their work as "Daoist" to the extent that they shared a certain cosmology, a certain metaphysical vocabulary, and specific methods of self-cultivation that would index them as being "Daoist."

Having said that, these kinds of lexical approximations and retrospective classifications probably work most effectively when they are thickly described in their various contexts with an acknowledgement of the conceptual complexity and historical diversity of the terms and problematics in question. In other words, when we can see how each term or category is used in the particular language game. However, to impose a problematic or category on a canon drawn up without reference to that problematic or category seems like it would inevitably result in serious conceptual distortion. In the case of Wen's attempt to articulate the "Chinese philosophical sensibility" through the "philosophical inquiries of Western philosophers," it seems as if the imposition of Western categories more often than not hinders the understanding of native Chinese thought rather than promotes it.

To take another example, consider the following description of Wang Fuzhi's thought:

In responding to the epistemology of Wang Yangming, Wang Fuzhi considered actions a priori to knowledge, meaning it is easy to know but difficult to act. For him, it is possible to carry out actions with knowledge. Knowing and acting are functions of one another. (136)

The introduction of the concept of the a priori has the unintended effect here of not only obscuring the Western connotations of the term but also convoluting Wang Fuzhi's originally simple idea that knowledge can only be obtained through experience and action. Although utilizing Western categories can help to locate the work of a master like Wang Fuzhi within a familiar discourse, it can also domesticate the original.

All of this is not to suggest that the ancient and imperial Chinese did not practice philosophy (they did) or were not familiar with philosophical questions (they were), but only that those practices and questions need not be the same practices and questions that inhabit our imaginations. In other words, we need not think of philosophy as a natural kind, "the name of a discipline which, in all ages and places, has managed to dig down to the same deep, fundamental, questions." Rather, we can think of the fundamental questions of philosophy as "the ones which everybody really ought have asked, or as the ones which everybody would have asked if they could, but not as the ones which everybody did ask whether they knew it or not."[6]

[1] Richard Rorty, "The Historiography of Philosophy: Four Genres," in Philosophy in History: Essays on the Historiography of Philosophy, ed. Richard Rorty, J. B.Schneewind, and Quentin Skinner (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1984), 62.

[2] See Lin Tongqi, Henry Rosemont, Jr., and Roger T. Ames, "Chinese Philosophy: A Philosophical Essay on the 'State-of-the-Art'," The Journal of Asian Studies54.3 (1995), 746:

In China, there were simply intellectuals -- the scholar-officials -- who, in addition to addressing issues considered philosophical (and/or religious) in the West, also wrote poetry, painted, studied history, practiced rituals, engaged in self-cultivation, and in the course of things, governed the nation, as well as much else; to attempt to separate out the purely philosophical (or religious) from the other cognitive activities of classical and imperial Chinese intellectuals might well be culturally question-begging at best, and at worst altogether obscurantic.

[3] Carine Defoort, "Is There Such a Thing as Chinese Philosophy? Arguments of an Implicit Debate," Philosophy East & West 51.3 (2001), 397.

[4] Lin, Rosemont, Jr., and Ames, "Chinese Philosophy: A Philosophical Essay on the 'State-of-the-Art'," 745.

[5] See Bryan Van Norden, Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2007), 21-23.

[6] Rorty, "The Historiography of Philosophy: Four Genres," 63.