Chomsky Notebook

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Jean Bricmont and Julie Franck (eds.), Chomsky Notebook, Columbia University Press, 2010, 351pp., $29.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231144759.

Reviewed by Nirmalangshu Mukherji , Delhi University


This book was originally published in French in 2007 under the title Chomsky. The English edition not only contains translations of the original French material, it has new substance as well. This publication history is a pointer to the specific structure and content of the volume to distinguish it from many Chomsky readers now on the market. As the editors of the volume put it, its aim is

to present an overview of Chomsky's thought to the French public and to pay homage to the importance of his oeuvre by highlighting the influence it has had in areas as diverse as theoretical linguistics, the study of the normal and pathological development of language, the philosophy of mind and the cognitive neurosciences, the analysis of ideology and power and of the media and the foreign policy of the United States, and in the discussion of freedom of expression, education, ethics, and political action (p. 54).

The vast terrain explored in Chomsky's prolific writings, lectures, and interviews for nearly six decades is not easy to cover in a single volume. Given obvious constraints, this volume is one of the most comprehensive, sensitive, and imaginative representations of Chomsky's oeuvre. Except for Chomsky's early work on computational theory and mathematical linguistics, which is too technical for the target audience, the volume manages to cover essentially every aspect of Chomsky's thought. It is a singular achievement.

As noted, the focus is on the French public. It is something of a puzzle in contemporary intellectual history that, notwithstanding Chomsky's global fame and influence, French intellectual culture continues to be generally hostile to Chomsky. Chomsky's own severely critical attitude to this culture only helped aggravate the situation. This is not to deny that, despite general hostility, there are some outstanding linguists and cognitive psychologists in France who have significantly advanced our knowledge in areas opened by Chomsky's thoughts. Yet, the general academic culture of France, especially in philosophy, anthropology, and socio-political theory, never really came to terms with Chomsky. And, given the influence leading academicians in France have on the popular culture, Chomsky's thoughts essentially bypassed France. The volume attempts to intervene in the situation by presenting Chomsky's thoughts in accessible terms without compromising on the subtlety and the rigour of the work his thoughts inspire. To that end, it also attempts to isolate and discuss those strands of Chomsky's thoughts that the French culture finds problematic.

The volume opens with two majestic essays by Chomsky himself. The first traces the scientific-philosophical tradition under which his own approach to the science of the mind falls. A general picture of "mitigated skepticism" emerges in which a scientific theory is restricted to its intelligibility -- the "ignorance hypothesis" (p. 9). Within this restriction, naturalistic inquiries on a par with the rest of science about aspects of the mind are possible if we give up the dogma of an unbridgeable gap between mind and body: "The theory of mind can be pursued in many ways, like other branches of science, with an eye to eventual unification, whatever form it may take, if any" (p. 17). The thesis militates against any perceived gulf between the natural and the "human sciences," as advocated in much of continental philosophy.

Chomsky's second essay -- the Edward Said memorial lecture -- discusses the role of intellectuals in the context of repressive powers of modern states. His general conclusion is that the "end of the last millennium was surely one of the low points in the generally dismal history of intellectuals" since "most kept to conformist subservience to those in power" (p. 35). More specifically, the essay elaborates with a wide range of scholarship and case studies how even the "left-liberal edge" of the intellectual spectrum in the U.S. contributed to the view that U.S. foreign policy -- often genocidal in character -- is endowed with a "powerful idealist element" which gained "particular salience" under Reagan and has been taken up with "unprecedented forcefulness" under Bush (p. 41). Later in the book, Chomsky holds that "many European intellectuals are even willing to grant the state the authority to be the official custodian of History, to determine 'Historical Truth' and punish deviation from it." Thus, Chomsky does not "agree with the belief of many European intellectuals that there is a 'huge variety of political and philosophical views' in Europe." He does not believe that these "self-serving and comforting views can withstand analysis" (p. 93).

Having set the stage, the essays are followed by a long and intense interview with Chomsky on specific aspects of the general cognitive and political perspectives sketched above. The incisive questions and Chomsky's (typically) frank and thorough answers cover impressive ground: in politics, they touch on Marxism, Stalinism, anarchism, the Kosovo war, neoliberalism, revolution, and solidarity; under science and philosophy, they cover the history of materialism, Cartesian philosophy, biology and human nature, among others. Although there is no direct articulation of the effort, the careful ordering of the issues across the two broad topics of politics and human nature is likely to leave the reader with an abiding impression that there is a subliminal unity in rational inquiry.

This preparatory stage is naturally followed by in-depth studies across a variety of disciplines that have been inspired by the broad Chomskyan program. Parts III and IV consist of six essays on syntax, semantics, neurolinguistics, nonhuman species, psycholinguistics, and philosophy. Part V has five essays under the general heading "Chomsky and the Intelligentsia". Part VI contains three essays on Chomsky's political thought.

Understandably, Parts III and IV are the richest in content in view of notable advances in the cognitive sciences. The essays are written by very distinguished scholars -- some are world-leaders -- in the concerned fields. Within the limited scope of a single moderately-sized paper, each scholar not only introduces a field using some leading ideas from Chomsky, but also furnishes enough theoretical and empirical details to give the uninitiated reader some sense of cutting-edge work -- a most impressive feat.

Thus, Norbert Hornstein and Cedric Boeckx trace the history of generative grammar in a way that naturally leads up to the current minimalist program and grounds the Chomskyan enterprise in (possible) theoretical biology. As they themselves note, their division of phases in generative grammar as combinatorics, cognitive and minimalist may not fully match Chomsky's writings. Arguably, all of them were present at each stage of Chomsky's thinking as it evolved for over half-a-century. Nonetheless, I agree with the authors that the suggested division serves a useful pedagogical purpose.

In a most lucid and engaging paper, Gennaro Chierchia introduces the classic Whorf-Sapir conjecture about the relation between language and reality, and focuses on the mass-count distinction to study the general issue. Somewhere around the middle, the discussion seamlessly becomes a full research enterprise incorporating a variety of ideas in lexical semantics and psycholinguistics. Having said this, the paper seems to be a mild misfit in the collection. For one thing, although the author is studying language, he hardly engages with Chomsky directly; Chomsky is not even mentioned in the references. For another, his approach to semantics via the familiar "model theory" -- in which linguistic objects (e.g., nouns) are linked to a finite enumeration of "objects" in a universe of discourse via the relation of reference or denotation -- has only superficial contacts with grammatical theory. In fact, Chomsky is quite skeptical of the very notion of reference for human languages.

In a short paper, Charles Gallistel reviews a range of fascinating work on insect navigation -- such as dead reckoning of desert ants, dancing of foraging bees, etc. -- to show how the basic Chomskyan idea that "the learner must compute from data a representation of the system that generated the data" works outside the domain of human language. For foraging bees, Gallistel argues that "built into the nervous system of the bee is a genetically specified neural circuit that takes as its input signals from the bee's circadian clock and gives as its output a signal specifying the compass direction of the sun" (p. 200). Obviously, huge assumptions are made about genetic specificity.

In a similar vein, Elizabeth Spelke reviews work about human infants and nonhuman animals, such as rats, to address a deep puzzle that contemporary experimental work on nonhuman species has unearthed. This work has shown that, with the exception of language, humans and nonhuman animals share a variety of cognitive capacities for reasoning and learning about food, systems for perceiving and learning about objects, etc. If humans are not to be identified in terms of domain-specific cognitive systems (except language), what distinguishes humans from nonhumans? Spelke deftly reports on over twenty years of work to suggest that, even though humans share a range of core systems with nonhumans, the latter do not have the capacity to combine the effects of these systems: for example, rats cannot combine information regarding colour and spatial orientation. Spelke concludes, "the capacity to combine core concepts freely and productively may give humans a range of choice far beyond what either our learning history or our evolutionary history would seem to allow" (p. 209).

With knowledge of the scientific aims of the Chomskyan program in hand, it is natural to expect some analysis of the philosophical foundations of the program and why it failed to inspire contemporary French philosophy. Pierre Jacob's lucid and comprehensive essay covers the first (foundational) aspect with a sustained exposition of Chomsky's views on methodological dualism, the character of naturalistic inquiry, and related issues. But there is no essay that links up directly with French philosophy to pave the way for the political essays that follow. This is disappointing since Chomsky holds pretty strong views about popular French philosophy -- one reason why Chomsky himself is not so popular in France. In their introduction, the editors cite Chomsky as follows: "we go from one absurdity to another -- Stalinism, existentialism, structuralism, Lacan, Derrida … What is striking is the pomposity and self-importance at each stage" (p. 72). Yet, with the exception of a very short and inadequate piece relating Chomsky and Pierre Bourdieu (Chomsky and Bourdieu are kindred souls in any case, especially in politics), there is no direct engagement with the leading French philosophers and schools of thought to explain why Chomsky holds, say, existentialism to be an "absurdity." An analysis of French philosophy to examine Chomsky's view of it would have been most instructive for the targeted audience of the volume. Instead of expanding further, the careful preparation marshaled in the first two-thirds of the volume begins to lose continuity and focus in the last one-third.

The essays in Parts V and VI generally attempt to counter criticisms of Chomsky emanating basically from establishment intellectuals, including the "left-liberal edge." But the choice of topics is limited to things like interpreting Chomsky's elaborate analysis of institutions as "conspiracy theories," the notorious Faurisson affair, and the marginal status of Chomsky's political writings in academia. No doubt, each of these "propagandistic" efforts on the part of French intellectuals had some effect in turning the intellectual audience away from Chomsky. As a later essay reports, "until recently, mention of Chomsky in leftist circles in France was likely to immediately evoke a mixture of fear and revulsion, so completely had his name come to be associated with a denial of the existence of the Nazi death camps during World War II" (Larry Portis, p. 322). As the essay by one of the editors -- Jean Bricmont -- shows, much of the attacks on the intellectual and moral credibility of Chomsky were based on outright lies and deliberate misinterpretation. These familiar and nefarious ploys need to be exposed.

But the question is how much weight ought to be placed on these otherwise superfluous issues in a volume devoted "to pay[ing] homage to the importance of his oeuvre"? In chasing artificial ghosts created by establishment intellectuals with blessings of the corporate media, the volume seems to have lost crucial pages which could have been devoted to more substantial issues emanating from Chomsky's life-long work; in fact, the incisive interview discussed above did isolate many of these issues. These "ghosts" are rampant in establishment circles everywhere in any case, including the United States. They do not throw light on the specificities of French intellectual culture. For example, the targeted audience is not informed about how the French left has understood the conflicts in Kosovo, Afghanistan, Latin America, and the Middle East, and where such understanding differs from Chomsky's. No essay discusses the current form of French opposition movements and whether or not their goals mesh with Chomsky's.

Although the anguish is understandable, most of the essays are too polemical in character -- too anecdotal and, often, too personal. They do not quite fit the image of rigorous and intense rational inquiry that is the hallmark even of Chomsky's political work. Akeel Bilgrami's philosophical piece on academic freedom does salvage calm rational discourse, but, as with Chierchia's essay discussed above, it fails to engage directly with Chomsky.

Despite this apparent departure from its professed goal, the book goes a long way toward informing its readers about how to evaluate -- in fact, to interpret -- the phenomenon of Chomsky. We may hope that, in its original French, this book played a significant role in shaping audience response when Chomsky visited France in the summer of 2010 after many decades.