Choosing Normative Concepts

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Matti Eklund, Choosing Normative Concepts, Oxford University Press, 2017, 219pp., $55.00, ISBN 9780198717829.

Reviewed by Tristram McPherson, Ohio State University


Consider the apparent possibility that we might have guided our lives by different normative concepts. This possibility prompts the question: are our actual normative concepts the best ones for the job? And this in turn motivates a philosophical project: to either find a way of vindicating our normative concepts, or a means of identifying better alternatives. This apparent possibility, and the attempt to address it, frame this book.

With some notable exceptions, when mainstream metaethicists focus on concepts, they focus on our actual ethical concepts. Eklund, by contrast, offers sustained and acute attention to issues raised by merely possible alternative normative concepts. This focus allows him to reveal a startling new terrain of important issues. Eklund doesn't explore this terrain in order to argue for a favored metanormative theory. Instead, his extraordinarily rich and original book focuses on revealing new problems and possibilities that anyone with serious interest in metaethics can learn from.

To get a feel for the central problem, consider a Bad Guy, who has bad motives, and does bad things. We can use our normative terms to criticize Bad Guy. But what if Bad Guy is part of a linguistic community with its own normative concepts? And what if Bad Guy's motives and actions line up perfectly with those concepts? This might evoke a kind of anxiety about our own normative concepts: in what non-trivial sense could they be better than Bad Guy's?

In order to generate this anxiety, Bad Guy's concepts need to conflict with ours. For example, if his normative concepts were just the norms of a horrible game that he happens to love playing, then we could criticize his choice to play that game, and there would be no obvious puzzle. Eklund proposes that what is required for the relevant sort of conflict is similarity in what he calls "normative role." Roughly, a normative concept's normative role is its downstream inferential role. For example, perhaps the concept practical ought has the role of settling deliberation, is associated with agency-directed criticism, etc. Suppose for the moment that one of Bad Guy's imagined concepts has the same normative role as the concept with which we criticize him, but a very different extension. This is the sort of scenario that Eklund dubs "Alternative" (See p.18 for the precise statement of Alternative.)

If we suppose that Alternative is possible, then Eklund shows that we can sharpen the anxiety just mentioned into a symmetry argument. Suppose that normative realism is true: for example, our concept practical ought picks out a relation instantiated in the actual world. And suppose that Bad Guy's linguistic community deploys a concept practical ought* that has the same normative role as our concept practical ought, but a quite different extension. You criticize Bad Guy for something he did, saying "You ought not to have done that." He points out correctly that he did what he ought* to have done. Suppose that the only further criticisms that you can raise of his action involve deploying your normative concepts. And suppose that for every such criticism, he can (without error) potentially raise a perfectly symmetrical criticism of you using his concepts (5).

The sort of symmetry just imagined might seem pretty alarming. A crucial assumption that gets the symmetry going is that Alternative is possible, and Eklund frames key discussions around the question of whether this assumption is correct. As Eklund shows (§2.1), leading theories of reference imply that Alternative is possible, when applied to normative concepts. (This point can be extracted from the Moral Twin Earth literature.) So it may seem that any theory that denies that Alternative is possible will need to be what Eklund usefully dubs "metasemantically radical" (43).

It might seem that if Alternative is possible, there is a substantive question concerning which of the conflicting sets of normative concepts "get things right" (22). But how could we formulate such a question? It is not clear that we can do so using our normative concepts (or Bad Guy's!). So it is not trivial to explain what the substantive question might be. If there is no such question, the alarming symmetry seems unbreakable. On the other hand, if there is a substantive question, this raises a novel kind of skeptical worry: that even if our normative beliefs are all true, and if we act in accordance with them, we might nonetheless be getting things -- in some important sense -- wrong (14-15; 25).

It is natural for a normative realist to attempt to address the alarming symmetry by appealing to metaphysics. Eklund argues against this strategy. For example, we might seek to break the symmetry by appealing to the idea that the extensions of our normative concepts are genuinely normative properties. But as Eklund points out, we can reintroduce the symmetry argument at the level of properties (9). Or we could appeal to an influential strand of contemporary metaphysics, and appeal to the idea that our concepts pick out properties that feature in the genuine structure of the world. But Eklund argues that this threatens to change the subject: intuitively put, the worry is that one property could be more metaphysically structural or fundamental, but nonetheless less normatively significant than another (30).

Eklund is more sympathetic to the idea that one might be able to avoid the alarming symmetry by denying that Alternative is possible. The idea here is that certain of our important normative concepts -- like practical ought -- might be such that their normative role metaphysically entails a unique referent. Eklund shows that this idea faces serious difficulties (see especially §§2.5 and 3.5). But he nonetheless argues that, at least for the ambitious sort of realist that he dubs the "ardent realist", this is the only potentially defensible option.

The dialectic just sketched dominates the first three chapters. The rest of the book pursues an extremely fecund discussion of related issues.

Chapters 4 and 5 explore the relationship between normative concepts and normative properties. To see the issue, consider that, if you are any conventional sort of normative realist, you will think that there are both normative concepts and normative properties. Furthermore, you will think that your normative concepts pick out normative properties, and that this is not an accident. It is natural to seek to explain this non-accidentality by telling a story about what it is to be a normative concept in terms of normative properties, or vice versa. However, as Eklund shows, both approaches face serious difficulties.

Chapter 6 considers a novel sort of view -- which Eklund dubs "presentationalism" -- that rejects the intuitive thought I used to frame the preceding paragraph. Presentationalism is the thesis that there are genuinely normative concepts and that those concepts pick out properties (or relations), but these properties are not themselves normative. (An orienting analogy may help: some philosophers accept that there are vague words and concepts but deny that there can be any vagueness "in the world.") Eklund offers a clear explanation for how presentationalism could be true. And he shows that its availability in the dialectic makes trouble for several prominent arguments in contemporary metaethics.

Chapter 7 discusses "anti-normativism." The anti-normativist grants that there are some things that we ought to do, and avows being against doing those things. The preceding discussion provides materials with which we can understand the anti-normativist as philosophically interesting (as opposed to being deranged or superficially confused). For example, the anti-normativist might think that Alternative is possible, and that, despite referring, our normative concepts are not the best ones for the job.

Chapters 8-10 put the tools developed in the book to work on a wide range of topics of interest to contemporary metaethics. These topics include thick normative concepts (discussion of which features throughout, and in a dedicated chapter), normative indeterminacy, quietism, creeping minimalism, essential contestability, robust vs. formal normativity, epistemic normativity, and conceptual engineering. Despite this dizzying agenda, Eklund's discussion is consistently illuminating.

Thus far I have set aside criticism, in an effort to convey as much as possible of the considerable interest of this book. I will close with some qualifications of my praise. Eklund is most convincing when identifying important possibilities that have been neglected in the literature, which he does repeatedly. His arguments against possibilities are typically less persuasive. In many cases, they are best seen as framing a challenge that proponents of the target possibilities can be expected to take up.

This is in part an inevitable result of the fact that the book covers so much terrain. As a result, Eklund dedicates relatively little space to each of his arguments. The most serious example is his rejection of the appeal to normative properties to address the alarming symmetry mentioned above. In my view, this is one of the central moves of the book; it is set out in a single paragraph (9).

A compounding issue is that the book typically proceeds with ruthless abstraction. For example, normative role is absolutely crucial to the discussion, but the reader is never given a particularly rich or robust characterization of this key idea. As a result, we are left with an abstract gloss, which is asked to carry a lot of argument.

In key places, the abstract character of the discussion combines to unfortunate effect with a regrettable lack of generality. I will offer two examples. The first is a central aspect of the book that I have not emphasized. Eklund frames his discussion of alternative normative concepts in terms of a character he dubs the "ardent realist." The guiding idea is that for the ardent realist, "reality itself favors certain ways of valuing and acting" (1). Eklund often proceeds by asking what it would take for ardent realism to be true, or what would satisfy such a realist. However, he declines to identify any actual philosophers as ardent realists; the quoted passage is clearly intended as metaphorical; and it is not easy to extract a non-metaphorical characterization of the view from Eklund's text.

This focus on ardent realism seems to me to obscure rather than to illuminate the dialectic around Alternative. And that's coming from someone who is (as far as I can tell) sympathetic to ardent realism! Consider philosophers who reject ardent realism, or are agnostic about it. I suspect that many of them will be gripped by the alarming symmetries that Eklund presents, and by the possible ways of seeking to address them. To such readers, there will be a non-trivial philosophical task to extract what is most interesting in Eklund's arguments from its entanglement with the somewhat opaque notion of ardent realism.

The second example concerns the priority question discussed in Chapters 4 and 5. Recall that the most general question here is: are normative concepts normative in virtue of some relation to normative properties, or vice versa? Eklund rarely takes up this question in its general form. Nonetheless, the discussion gives a strong impression that he does not think that either priority relation holds (the thrust of Ch. 4 is systematically critical of the properties-first view, and 99-100 raises trouble for the concepts-first view). Eklund does, however, find it plausible that there is a necessary connection between the two (99). In my view, it is strikingly implausible that there is simply no explanation of this connection. And it is unfortunate that Eklund never considers this apparent implication of the hypotheses he appears to find most promising.

Finally, a rhetorical point: the different discussions in the book are thematically connected, but there is no consistent argumentative thread, and very often Eklund is explicitly modest about his commitments and the force of the arguments he presents. In many ways, this is refreshing and constructive. But at times it can also make the book feel elusive or protean, and it may frustrate readers expecting a more traditional monograph.

Despite these caveats, I recommend the book wholeheartedly: if any of the topics mentioned here pique your interest, I assure you that more riches lie within.