Choosing to Die: Elective Death and Multiculturalism

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C. G. Prado, Choosing to Die. Elective Death and Multiculturalism, Cambridge UP, 2008, 211pp., $23.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521697583.

Reviewed by Margaret P. Battin, University of Utah



The central practical issue that this thorough, stimulating, and important book addresses is whether suicide can be rational in the context of terminal illness. Answers to this issue can be readily formulated in the familiar context of western political thought, with its liberal paradigm of autonomy: yes, suicide can be rational if elected in a clear-thinking, voluntary way, without pressure or undue influence, external or internal, and with full information, but without other impairment; or no, suicide is irrational, since it may be based on a narrow, pessimistic view of one’s future, on short discounts and high emotionality, or because it fails to recognize the impossibility of discerning what (if anything) comes after death. This is a well-worn debate in the current literature on assisted suicide, a literature that is heating up again as a second U.S. state, Washington, follows Oregon in legalizing physician-assisted dying by voter referendum. The Montana Supreme Court is scheduled to decide whether medical aid-in-dying is protected under the state constitution. At the same time, two additional European countries, Belgium and Luxembourg, have followed the Netherlands in legalizing physician assistance in dying, and Switzerland and Germany also permit assisted- dying practices in distinctive ways. The issue Prado is addressing is a pressing one for all countries with highly sophisticated health care systems, in which terminal illness may be an extended and highly medicalized affair and in which concepts of individual autonomy play a major political role.

C. G. Prado’s new book goes far beyond the familiar discussions that have played back and forth among the various factions in this highly contentious social issue. Prado draws on the distinction he explored in an earlier book, The Last Choice, between preemptive suicide intended to avoid the worst that might occur in the final stages of terminal illness, and surcease suicide, an escape from those sufferings once they are already occurring. Prado rightly points out that the political background against which these debates have been conducted has been shifting in the last decade — he implies that there has been a “steadily increasing measure of latitude”, a perception with which I’d certainly agree [p. 159]. “The idea of preserving life at all costs has waned in importance”, he writes,

and there has been growing recognition that life is not of ultimate and unquestionable value. Given this appreciation, someone’s choosing to die rather than bear great suffering is now seen as wise and heroic, when not long ago it was seen as cowardly and immoral, if not pathological. [p. 7]

Choosing to Die is entirely alert to these shifts, but it is by no means limited to identifying them. What this book adds to the debate is real recognition of the theoretical challenges posed both by the evolution of social attitudes and at the same time, though not identical to it, the changing character of contemporary society. Prado complains that “many relativize not only morality but rationality itself to culture”; “many more fail to see how the rationality of choosing to die can be assessed separately from its moral permissibility” [p. 23].

The book thus has a double texture. Prado’s strategy for addressing multiculturalism involves introducing two key concepts: “coincidental culture”, intended to clarify decision-influencing values and commitments in all their remarkable variety, and “proxy premises”, intended to address issues of rationality in the face of intractably held beliefs. These concepts are utilized to try to explore how the varying values of differing cultural subgroups affect assessments of suicide, either preemptive or surcease, within indigenous, religious, and minority communities, especially when these values are all evolving over time. Prado’s sensitivity to such issues is a major step forward in the discussion of physician-assisted suicide; I can think of no work more alert to the doubly textured challenges of a diverse and changing society than this one. It is relevant that Prado lives and teaches in Canada; this is a country perhaps as alert and open to issues of multiculturalism as any.

There are a few places in Choosing to Die where Prado might take multiculturalism a step further, noting the variations not only in moral assessments and criteria for rationality but also conceptual frameworks. For example, he argues that physician-assisted suicide is not the same thing as physician-performed euthanasia. But in some cultures, notably that of the Netherlands, they are largely equated: what is seen as important is that both involve a patient’s elective decision to die, and the manner of bringing about the lethal end is seen as of lesser consequence [p. 10]. Prado doesn’t need to take sides in the relativism debates or the issue of whether differing cultural practices still point to common core values (e.g., attention to the best interests of the patient). There’s some annoying labeling: for example, “PS1” for preemptive suicide “considered and committed during Stage One”, “SS2” for surcease suicide “considered and committed during Stage Two”, “AS3” for assisted surcease suicide “considered and committed at Stage Three”, and “RE4” for requested or voluntary euthanasia “considered and requested at State Four” [p. 29 and passim]. Not only do these labels (not even acronyms!) require the reader to translate back into real language the concepts Prado is employing, but they suggest that there is a uniform progression (viz, stages 1, 2, 3, 4) in the process of dying. Prado provides a hypothetical case to illustrate such a progression, but does not supply adequate evidence or argument for the universal applicability of this pattern. The categories of PS1, SS2, etc. are not as neat or clean as Prado’s labeling might seem to suggest and are not necessarily ordered in this way, while the forms of rationality or departures from it, both in one’s own reasoning and in that of observers, are not nearly as easily classified. On the contrary, dying can be conceptually messy: for example, one might already be in the state labeled 2 under Prado’s system but still be engaging in preemptive suicide, that is, be in the process of ending one’s own life to preclude a future state of affairs feared as still worse. Prado does recognize these problems [see p. 161, for example], but not nearly as thoroughly as might be hoped.

Prado argues that the rationality criterion requires acknowledgment that death may be annihilation [ch. 7]. Here, I think, he sees the issue from only one perspective. He ought also to consider the convinced, secular skeptic’s concerns about religions’ claims for the possibility of an afterlife, and whether this person’s choices about suicide can be rational if he or she fails to acknowledge that death may not be annihilation.

To be sure, the annihilation assumption is one of the easiest to address, since after all the issue in physician-aided dying isn’t life vs. death, but life for a shorter period of time now vs. life for a little longer, followed by death in either case — or, to put it another way, death now vs. death a little later. The same state, annihilation or non-annihilation, will presumably occur in either case, unless one supposes that actions in this life make the difference between annihilation and nonannihilation. This is not typically what religious traditions hold; they rather assume nonannihilation, but in better or worse states. There is of course a lot more Prado could say about the rationality of operating under various secular and religious assumptions about what comes after death (if anything), but his discussion is nevertheless illuminating.

Despite these minor difficulties, Choosing to Die offers cogent discussions of issues of rationality, something in which Prado has long been interested, and it is impressively sensitive both to variation among individuals and to variation among religious and cultural traditions. Prado is quite aware of the gap between theory and practice, as well as the obfuscations and indirection of the pretences concerning the right to die under current legal regimes. Rational choices to die can currently be honored in most jurisdictions only by not acting — that is, one can choose to die and/or get others to act on one’s choice, but only if it involves inaction, such as withholding lifesaving therapy or refraining from continuing it; Prado adroitly exposes the absurdity of this imbalance in the context of choosing to die [p. 159].

If you’re going to read just one chapter (which I don’t recommend, unless the only alternative is reading no chapters), try chapter 8 on “assessment latitude”, an exploration of how clinicians, family members, and others should observe and evaluate choices to die. This chapter is particularly alert to the realities of patients’ changing conditions, especially the moral significance of deterioration. But I certainly don’t recommend reading just one chapter. This is a densely articulated and argued book with an extraordinarily important set of central concerns, and it is well worth reading the whole thing.