Christian Ethics and Commonsense Morality: An Intuitionist Account

Placeholder book cover

Kevin Jung, Christian Ethics and Commonsense Morality: An Intuitionist Account, Routledge, 2015, 202pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138840676.

Reviewed by Daniel Crow, University of Wisconsin-Madison


It is easy to be misled by the title of Kevin Jung's new book. Jung does not discuss either Commonsense Morality or intuitionism until the antepenultimate chapter, and he does not focus on Christian Ethics until the final one. So what is the majority of this book actually about? I think the best way to describe it is as a defense of a coherent set of philosophical positions that are each highly regarded in the Analytic Philosophical Tradition (viz. foundationalism, moral realism, and intuitionism) addressed to philosophical concerns characteristic of the Continental Tradition.

Jung articulates some of these concerns in the opening chapter, "Varieties of Postmodern Ethics." The common thread he discerns running through the philosophies of Heidegger, Levinas, Derrida, Nietzsche, and the American Pragmatists, among others, is a "suspicion of reason as a trustworthy source of knowledge" (8). Since we all reason in a particular social context -- and, even more narrowly, within our own conceptual frameworks -- it is doubtful, according to many of these thinkers, that reason can lead us beyond our limited perspectives to objective moral knowledge.

In contrast with these postmodern thinkers, Jung is more optimistic about reason. In Chapter 2, "Is Foundationalism Dead?" he defends moderate foundationalism against Jeffrey Stout's critique. Unlike Stout's favored contextualism, moderate foundationalism admits sources of epistemic justification that are not socially constructed. Much later in the book, Jung complements moderate foundationalism with a specific moral epistemology -- namely, intuitionism. But before he does that, he will investigate topics in moral metaphysics for the next four chapters. His discussion of moral realism, which covers Chapters 3 and 4, is also optimistic about reason insofar as Jung argues that we can have knowledge of moral properties that exist "apart from moral conception" (63). I will look at Jung's discussion of moral realism in considerable detail since it is, in various ways, representative of the book as a whole.

One way it is representative is in its interdisciplinary breadth: Jung considers moral realism from Analytic, Continental, and Christian perspectives. In Chapter 3, "Moral Realism according to Lovibond and Hauerwas," Jung opens with a definition of moral realism drawn from the Analytic Tradition. According to the "standard philosophical account," as he refers to it, moral properties are "real" in the sense that that they do not depend on anyone's attitudes towards the actions that ground them (44). For example, if torturing innocent people is wrong, this property of wrongness does not depend on anyone's attitudes towards torture. In the standard philosophical taxonomy, moral realism is most directly opposed to metaethical constructivism, which claims that the moral properties of actions do indeed depend on certain attitudes.

What Sabina Lovibond and Stanley Hauerwas mean by "moral realism" is something completely different. If the philosophical account of moral realism is opposed to metaethical constructivism, Lovibond's "Wittgensteinian version of moral realism" is embedded in a kind of global linguistic constructivism (44). Lovibond is concerned that the language of empirical science is often assigned a higher "value" than moral language: as, for instance, when the former is dignified as descriptive while the latter is denigrated as merely expressive (46). Against this inequality, she endorses a "seamless" view of language according to which all language games equally construct the truths of their respective subject matters (46). Given this framework, morality is just as real as the subject matter of science. And "moral realism," as Lovibond uses the term, signifies the promotion of morality to the status of science. According to Jung's summary of her position: "Moral discourse then is realist in the sense that it represents the social world of moral agents who perceive moral features of reality in light of their social practice" (46).

Influenced by Lovibond, Hauerwas applies a similar Wittgensteinian framework to Christian communities in particular. According to Jung's summary of Hauerwas's account: "Christian moral concepts and judgments are real in the sense that they are meant to represent the social world of the Christian community" (54). While this certainly sounds like a metaethical position -- perhaps a thesis in moral semantics -- Hauerwas resists this label. He is a "strong critic" of metaethics because "he regards the project of grounding ethics in an ahistorical foundation and of freeing ethics from the historical contingencies of actual moralities as hopeless and misguided" (52). So before Jung can criticize Hauerwas's metaethical views, he spends some time arguing that Hauerwas in fact has metaethical views. Pointing out various ways in which Hauerwas's Wittgensteinian stance is not metaethically neutral, Jung argues persuasively that "even if one refuses to engage in metaethics, it does not follow that one's ethics is therefore immune to criticisms from metaethics" (52).

Jung's evaluation of these different accounts of moral realism is also representative of his more general approach. After considering accounts of moral realism drawn from both sides of the Analytic/Continental Divide, he finally comes down -- after some Continental gymnastics -- on the Analytic side. Jung's central criticism of both Wittgensteinian versions of moral realism is that they lead to an objectionable form of "epistemic relativism" about the justification of moral beliefs (50, 59). The standard philosophical account of moral realism, Jung suggests, avoids the charge of moral relativism. But before Jung endorses this account, he is careful to show that it has the resources to address some of the philosophical concerns raised in Chapter 1.

In Chapter 4, "How to Defend Moral Realism," Jung introduces a new "species" of the philosophical account of moral realism: William Schweiker's "hermeneutical realism" (64). What it adds to the genus is the complex claim that certain cultural projects of human self-interpretation and meaning-making (hermeneutics broadly construed) can affect our conceptual frameworks in epistemically beneficial ways -- making the moral properties that exist independently of them more salient. Essentially, hermeneutical realism acknowledges the importance of our social context and conceptual frameworks to moral epistemology -- thus it addresses a Continental concern -- while still claiming, as a species of the philosophical account, that moral properties exist independently of our any of our thoughts about them.

While Jung charts an intricate course through this sea of moral realisms, I do worry that he overlooks metaethical positions that do not go by this name. For example, Ideal Observer Theory is a species of metaethical constructivism that posits fewer constructed properties than Lovibond's moral realism and arguably avoids any charge of moral relativism. Yet in spite of its clear relevance to his dialectic, Jung does not mention it -- I suspect because no one has ever called it "moral realism." By allowing a nominal criterion to decide which views receive consideration, Jung may unfortunately allow semantic currents to determine the course of his discussion.

I will bypass the next two chapters -- during which Jung argues that moral properties cannot be reduced to various sets of descriptive properties -- to sooner address the antepenultimate chapter, "Commonsense Tradition and Intuitionism," in which Jung finally introduces his account of Commonsense Morality. According to Jung, the "commonsense tradition" is "the morality which all human beings share by virtue of being human, a morality that can be epistemically (as opposed to historically) independent upon their particular historical context" (118). By identifying the source of this independent epistemic justification as "intuition," Jung links the commonsense tradition to a particular moral epistemology, which he will continue to defend in the penultimate chapter, entitled "Intuitionism: Philosophical Issues and Replies."

Leaning heavily on the work of Robert Audi, Jung unpacks intuitionism in terms of self-evidence. A proposition is self-evident if it can be known on the basis of an adequate understanding alone. But even if it is true that some proposition is self-evident, it does not follow that anyone who considers it will immediately (or ever) believe it. An adequate understanding of a self-evident proposition often requires "time and careful reflection" (128). Because of this reflective requirement, intuition is not an infallible source of moral knowledge. Like the capacity for perception, though, it is generally reliable and (as Jung emphasizes) is a universal source of moral knowledge.

In addition to intuition, Christians have a second source of moral knowledge: "divine revelation," which Jung once identifies as "the Bible" (although none of his arguments require this restriction of divine revelation to a single source, 162). When thinking about ethics, Christians should certainly try to determine what divine revelation has to say about the issue at hand. But what role should Christian Ethicists afford moral intuition? This interesting question, which deserves a book in its own right, is unfortunately allotted only the final chapter of this one. In Chapter 9, "Commonsense Morality and Christian Morality," Jung at last addresses this question by evaluating three different models for relating these two moral systems.

According to the Identity Model, the

types of moral properties in Christian morality are identical to those moral properties in commonsense morality in all respects. Thus, if a particular type of moral property, say generosity, is considered to be a moral property in Christianity, the same is also true in commonsense morality, and vice versa. (157)

By contrast, the other two models assume not only that the two moral systems are non-identical but also that they are sometimes opposed. In cases of conflict, the Two-Tier Model claims that Christian Morality (occupying the higher tier) always trumps commonsense while the Integration Model maintains that our intuitions should be counted as "epistemic evidence" which should be brought into epistemic relationships of "mutual support" with our interpretations of divine revelation (167).

Before looking at Jung's evaluation of these models, I want to raise a question of clarification regarding their formulations. With respect to the identity claim that defines the first model and the conflict assumed by the second two, it was unclear whether the relevant propositions compare the actual or ideal uses of the two sources of moral knowledge that Jung identifies. As noted above, Jung allows that we can fail to use intuition properly -- when, for example, someone forms a belief about a complicated self-evident proposition without due reflection. And it is obvious that we make mistakes in our interpretations of divine revelation as well. Since human beings misuse each of these sources of moral knowledge, it seems inevitable that Christian Morality and Commonsense Morality will diverge in the actual world. The more interesting question is not whether the two moral systems are actually identical but whether they would be identical if we were to use our intuition properly and our interpretive tools aright. In order to interpret the Identity Model so that it is not trivially false, I will understand it to claim that the moral propositions we can know via idealized intuition are identical to those we can know via idealized interpretation of divine revelation.

Jung rejects the Identity Model on the grounds that Christian Morality is more comprehensive than Commonsense Morality -- "comprehensive" in the sense that "it covers all recognized values and virtues in various domains of human life, is often accompanied by a particular conception of the good life rooted in a certain kind of metaphysics, religious or philosophical" (159). Moreover, it addresses "a wide range of moral topics, from sex to politics to economy" (159). Since Christian Morality includes additional metaphysical and ethical commitments that Commonsense Morality does not, the two moral systems cannot be strictly identical.

They may still be identical, though, in the most interesting sense. I wish Jung would have considered the possibility that the additional moral commitments of the more comprehensive Christian system could be derived by combining its additional non-moral commitments with moral principles that can be known via intuition. For an example of how such a derivation might work, consider one of the metaphysical propositions that Jung includes in the more comprehensive moral system: the claim that God created us and became incarnate in order to benefit us. Now, combine this with the moral principle, recognized by Commonsense Morality, that we ought to be grateful to our benefactors. From this metaphysical doctrine and this principle of commonsense it follows that we ought to be grateful to God -- which partly explains the particular Christian duty to worship God. In a similar fashion, the more comprehensive non-moral commitments of Christian morality might explain all of its distinctive moral commitments. The two moral systems might then be identical in the sense of converging on the same moral principles.

Jung's discussion of the other two models for relating Christian Morality and Commonsense Morality makes more sense given the actual (=non-ideal) epistemic conditions. Against the Two-Tier Model, Jung notes that the Bible is "a major source of dispute among its interpreters" and that the church has been "inconsistent over the centuries" (162). Given all of this interpretive confusion, Jung concludes, it makes sense to trust our moral commonsense even when it is at odds with our favored interpretation of the Bible or the present testimony of the church. Some of this confusion, however, is presumably the result of sloppy and self-interested human misinterpretations of divine revelation. It is unclear whether Jung's reasons for siding with moral intuition would still apply in those cases where human beings make the best possible use of divine revelation.

In his defense of the Integration Model, Jung similarly appeals to cases that suggest interpretive error. For example, he imagines an "alleged Christian community" with a "coherent theological system" that encourages incest (164). The problem he identifies with this community is that it disregards the epistemic evidence of moral intuition. Later in the chapter, Jung makes a similar judgment of the ecclesial panels that judge allegations of sexual abuse in the church. He contends, reasonably, that they should have to justify their verdicts by appeals to both divine revelation (or "evidence . . . said to be intelligible to only a few") and moral intuition:

My point is that Christians should not demand two separate ways of justifying moral beliefs, one for Christians and the other for non-Christians. In fact, Christians should affirm the idea that any claims to moral knowledge must be ultimately justified on the grounds of universally accessible epistemic evidence. (165)

Jung's conclusion here suggests that any moral proposition that can be known via divine revelation can also be known via moral intuition, which is consistent with the idealized Identity Model I explained above. It is also consistent with the reasonable view, unfortunately excluded from Jung's taxonomy, that Commonsense Morality is in one significant sense more comprehensive than Christian Morality: that a wider set of moral principles can be known via moral intuition than are vouchsafed in divine revelation. In this chapter, as in his book as a whole, Jung covers a lot of ground and ultimately stakes out a plausible and well-grounded position -- but his coverage is sometimes spotty and overlooks some important philosophical plots.