Christian Faith and Human Understanding: Studies on the Eucharist, Trinity, and the Human Person

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Robert Sokolowski, Christian Faith and Human Understanding: Studies on the Eucharist, Trinity, and the Human Person, Catholic University of America Press, 2006, 317pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0813214440.

Reviewed by David Burrell, C.S.C., University of Notre Dame


Robert Sokolowski, an eminent phenomenologist and a celebrated teacher, here offers us a strategic set of essays encapsulating his intellectual development over two decades. And that is what makes the collection useful, for those of us who have known him for his writing in phenomenology, or (for me) his groundbreaking God of Faith and Reason, can learn from the dispassionate yet uncompromising way in which he follows reason to the limit in exploring the deliverances of faith. Indeed, the witness he gives in critical exploration of faith stands in sober contrast to the multiple ways in which "religion" is employed ideologically in our world today, as in naïve appeals to "intelligent design." For Sokolowski's work exhibits the contention central to the work itself: that the avowal of a free creator leaves "natural necessities" quite intact. One of these is, of course, the need for rational argument. At the same time, however, the presence of a free creator can transform our intellectual strategies.

Indeed, the two-fold program of these essays -- and they cohere nicely into a program -- is stated thus:

The most systematic form in which philosophy has been achieved within Christian revelation has been the metaphysics of esse that was elaborated in the middle ages. The divine perfection and glory were expressed as belonging to esse per se subsistens, which was also seen as the cause of all limited forms of esse. I would suggest that philosophy can now perform another reflective and systematic role in regard to Christian faith. It can clarify the manifestation of what is believed. In doing this, it can draw on philosophical resources provided by phenomenology. It would be possible to call such a form of Christian thinking by the term "phenomenological theology," but this expression is unwieldy in English; I would propose instead terms like "the theology of disclosure" or "the theology of manifestation". (36)

So his move elucidating "the distinction" of creatures from creation, which relies crucially on the "the metaphysics of esse … elaborated in the middle ages," had already adumbrated this proposal of a fresh set of strategies for theology, by noting how this elusive distinction "emerges at the intersection of faith and reason."

Indeed, we may see his use of the term "distinction," so central to phenomenology, as a philosophical conceit for treating the activity unique to creation: "as that which defines how we are to understand God, how we are to understand the world, and how we are to understand the relationship between the world and God" (38). Moreover, by employing "the distinction" in this way, he can show how "Creation is related to other [Christian] teachings in a way that is logically distinctive … [for it] opens the logical and theological space for other Christian beliefs and mysteries" (38). And "to pay attention, systematically, to [such] relationships … is part of what I would like to call the theology of disclosure" (39). So Sokolowski's use of phenomenology to elucidate his Catholic faith shades imperceptibly into his proposed "theology of disclosure," which is hardly inappropriate, since the umbrella term "philosophical theology" reveals that "philosophers of religion" who so identify themselves are in fact engaged in theology. In so doing, Sokolowski displays the full range of reason required for "faith to seek understanding," thereby offering a trenchant challenge to "philosophers of religion" who egregiously introduce "God" without attending to the key role which creation plays in keeping such discourse from drifting into idolatry. For any attempt to parse, say, human and divine action without attending to "the distinction" will invariably treat "God" as an actor comparable to humans, and so in effect be speaking of a god.

What is so illustrative about Sokolowski's mode of inquiry is the deft way in which he displays how "the Christian understanding introduces a new horizon or context for the modes of possibility, actuality, and necessity" which characterizes philosophical elucidation, as it "distinguishes the divine and the world in such a way that God could be, in undiminished goodness and greatness, even if everything were not" (41). Indeed, this is the metaphysical upshot of the axial teaching on free creation (shared with Jews and Muslims): "the being of things is now questioned in a new setting," thereby "open[ing] the logical and theological space for other Christian beliefs and mysteries" as "this sense of Creation introduces a new slant on being, on what it is to exist, and on all the modalities of being … [since] things are profiled not against the world and its elementary forces, but against not being at all" (41-2). Put more contentiously, this means that philosophical theologians who operate self-consciously in a Christian tradition, cannot presume to employ the strategies of modal logic without asking how they might apply to creatures, and a fortiori, logical tools like the "existential operator," as in "there is such a person as god." Unless they want to settle for the lower case! So much for Sokolowski's adroit challenge to current Christian "philosophy of religion," which seems quite innocent of "the distinction," introduced in his 1982 masterpiece The God of Faith and Reason. The four initial essays (under "Faith and Reason") spell out this faith-inspired challenge in diverse contexts.

Section two presents "theology of disclosure" in five chapters under "Eucharist and Holy Trinity." While these are expressly theological in subject and in tone, his "Revelation of the Holy Trinity: A study in Personal Pronouns" (Ch. 9) extends Aquinas' insistence that the processions of the trinity model the activity of creating by using them to illuminate what is distinctive about persons: "the use of the term I reveals the person of the speaker in its actual exercise, its being-at-work as a person," which allows him to explicate his use of "the term 'an agent of truth' to say what a person is" (136-7). The next section explores "the human person," as he has already asserted that "this sense of Creation … also introduces a new slant on ourselves" (41-2). Five illuminating perspectives show how faith can transform ordinary categories for persons. The first explores the language of "soul and the transcendence of the human person" to suggest how "the material components of a living being are affected by the whole" (156) and especially transformed in spiritual beings, as he tries "to convey in an intuitive manner what we mean by spirit and its life" (157). The following chapter details how "the word person functions in an unusual and interesting way," in that it does not "name a kind of thing," but is itself "a radically individualized term. It expresses a singularity" (165-6), albeit a radically historical one. Indeed, by illustrating the grammar peculiar to 'person' he will lead us through the intricacies of effecting grammatical speech to detail the "radical individuality of each person" (174) as well as our capacity for transforming relationships of friendship (177). In proper Aristotelian fashion, he then turns to "the human person and political life," to show how a human who is inherently political "can be destroyed by rampant individualism no less than by totalitarian regimes." Indeed,

liberal individualism harms the person slowly and silently through a notion of freedom as absence of any and all constraints on the individual's choice… . thus the two seemingly different modern regimes both destroy the person. (196)

The high point of this section explores "the Christian difference in personal relationships" (Ch. 13), where displaying the paradigmatic role which friendship plays in Aristotle as "the culmination of moral virtue" (206) allows him to underscore "the difference between the human being and the person" (207) to show how startling is Jesus' "invit[ing] us to friendship with him," thereby "introduc[ing us] into the truth of the relationship between Christ and the Father" (209). Here again, it is free creation which sets up this startling about-face, for "the idea that we could be friends with the first principle of the universe is something that would sound like utter foolishness to pagan thinkers" (209). So "the distinction" not only warrants yet more startling assertions, but

because Christ draws us into this form of friendship with God, it becomes possible for us to declare ourselves, to use the first-person singular pronoun in our relationship with God himself. We can say 'I believe', or 'I love' … not only before other people but also before and towards God. (209-10)

This exploration permits an astute recasting of "natural law" which relates ethics with "philosophical and theological anthropology" (231) to allow quite traditional renderings of "natural law" to flower into "a deeper sense of goodness and virtue (as well as a deeper sense of evil and vice)" (232).

The fourth and final section details the relevance of faith for practical reasoning, ranging from "the fiduciary relationship and the nature of professions" (Ch. 16) and "some phenomenological contributions" to religion in the practice of psychoanalysis (Ch.17), to more institutional reflections on "church tradition and the Catholic university" (Ch. 18) and "philosophy in the seminary curriculum" (Ch. 19). These essays prove most fruitful in displaying Sokolowski's conviction that a properly trained philosophical mind can bring clarity to contentious issues, especially when tempered by a compassionate and caring spirit. For that is what these essays display throughout.