Christian Philosophy: Conceptions, Continuations, and Challenges

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J. Aaron Simmons (ed.), Christian Philosophy: Conceptions, Continuations, and Challenges, Oxford University Press, 2019, 309pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198834106.

Reviewed by R.T. Mullins, University of St Andrews


What is Christian philosophy? Where has it been, and where is it going? These, and other related questions, are the main focus of J. Aaron Simmons' edited volume. Simmons has brought together an interesting collection of classic and cutting-edge essays that seek to push new boundaries in our understanding of Christian philosophy. Diverse perspectives are brought to bear on the questions so as to demonstrate the breadth of the field.

The book is broken down into three sections: "Conceptions", "Continuations", and "Challenges". "Conceptions" contains six essays, four of which have been previously published. The section starts off with Alvin Plantinga's 1983 classic, "Advice to Christian Philosophers." It is followed by Jean-Luc Marion's "'Christian Philosophy': Hermeneutic or Heuristic?" I found the Marion essay interesting because it gives a more continental approach to Christian philosophy, thus contrasting nicely with Plantinga's analytic approach. However, I find the Marion essay oddly placed because the essay is never touched on again in the book. Whereas an overwhelming majority of the essays are responses to Plantinga's essay. For example, the next three in the "Conceptions" section are responses to Plantinga by Kyla Ebels-Duggan, Merold Westphal, and Bruce Ellis Benson. To be sure, each of these gives interesting insights and critiques into Plantinga's conception of Christian philosophy. It is just telling that Plantinga's approach to Christian philosophy takes centre stage in this volume. It demonstrates the extent of Plantinga's influence on the field. Other, non-Plantinga, approaches are considered. "Conceptions" ends with an essay by Kevin Hart on Christian phenomenology. Yet, even this essay can't help but critically comment on Plantinga's analytic approach to Christian philosophy.

Section two, "Continuations", offers five essays that seek to expand the scope of Christian philosophy. Charles Taliaferro's "On Divine Dedication: Philosophical Theology with Jeremy Taylor" explores the theme of dedication, and its implications for philosophy of religion. Neal DeRoo's "Discerning the Spirit: The Task of Christian Philosophy" argues that Christian philosophy is not merely a rational activity, but also a spiritual activity. According to DeRoo, one task of the Christian philosopher is to examine the spirits of the age to avoid worshipping idols. Kevin Timpe's "Christian Philosophy and Disability Advocacy" offers an interesting example of how a philosopher can live out a Christian life. Timpe draws several parallels between Christian philosophy and disability advocacy such as their normative, hermeneutical, developmental, and communal dimensions. Meghan Sullivan's "Teaching Evil" explains a bit of her approach to teaching Christian philosophy. She discusses something called dialectical mismatch. This is when one side of a debate has a simple, easy to follow argument, but the response is complex and the evidence is difficult to transmit. As Sullivan explains, the problem of evil against the existence of God is fairly easy to state, and theistic counter-arguments are difficult to transmit. Thus, there is a dialectical mismatch. According to Sullivan, this doesn't mean that the theistic counter-arguments are bad; it just presents a pedagogical challenge to debate in the classroom.

"Continuations" concludes with Trent Dougherty's "Advice for Analytic Theologians: Faith-Guided Scholarship." Dougherty offers eight pieces of timely advice for this new field that has grown out of Plantinga's approach to Christian philosophy. The advice ranges from 'don't worry what analytic theology is, just do it,' to 'don't be intimidated by bullies.' Dougherty cautions analytic theologians to avoid fads, and to study the history of Christian thought. As an analytic theologian, I find this advice to be both apt and encouraging.

The final section is called "Challenges". This is my favourite section. It contains five essays that raise criticisms about the current state of Christian philosophy. It concludes with a response chapter by William Hasker ("Responding to Challenges"). I will discuss each easy in turn, and briefly state how Hasker replies to each essay as I go along.

Simmons starts the section with "The Strategies of Christian Philosophy." He questions the way that Plantinga often talks about the philosophical community as if it is a singular, monolithic group that is completely opposed to a singular Christian community. Simmons goes on to point out that some versions of naturalism and anti-realism might be compatible with some versions of Christianity, which is contrary to the story that Plantinga tells. Simmons also cautions about the growth of Christian philosophy. Christian philosophy appears to have grown significantly since 1983, and he warns against potential extremism, triumphalism, and arrogance within the field. In response, Hasker argues that Simmons is playing a bit fast and loose with the meanings of naturalism and anti-realism. According to Hasker, these concepts have well-established meanings within contemporary philosophy, and are most certainly at odds with a Christian worldview. Further, Hasker agrees that Christians should seek to avoid extremism, triumphalism, and arrogance. Yet, he notes that Simmons says that there is no evidence that Christian philosophers have fallen into these faults. In order to keep away from these faults, Hasker suggests that Christians should pay careful attention to the limitations of what Christian philosophers have actually achieved, and be thankful for the good things that God has given us.

Paul K. Moser's "Christian Philosophy and Christ Crucified: Fragmentary Theory in Scandalous Power" claims that Christian philosophy is not really Christian unless it starts with the crucified Christ. Moser asserts that Christian philosophers are often ashamed of the crucified Christ, and accuses them of idolatry. He calls on Christian philosophers to be epistemically humble. In response, Hasker questions the demand that every piece of Christian philosophy should reference the crucified Christ. As Hasker points out, most of Kierkegaard's philosophy makes no reference to the crucified Christ. Should we think that most of Kierkegaard's work is not really Christian philosophy? Further, he points out that Moser not only fails to tell us what Christian philosophy is, but also offers little engagement with Christian philosophers. Perhaps the lack of engagement is because Moser thinks most of it is idolatry. Hasker wonders why Moser's call for epistemic humility does not extend to Moser himself entertaining the notion that other Christian philosophers might have valuable work that Moser is unable to discern.

J. L. Schellenberg's "Is Plantinga-Style Christian Philosophy Really Philosophy?" offers an interesting argument for answering in the negative. Schellenberg focuses only on Plantinga's reformed Christian philosophy (RCP). Schellenberg is clear that other forms of Christian philosophy will be immune to the particular argument that he raises against RCP. RCP rejects positive apologetics, and seeks to answer philosophical problems by presupposing the truth of Christianity. This runs into conflict with something Schellenberg calls the communal condition for philosophy. He defines the communal condition as follows: "to be doing philosophy one must aim not just to solve certain fundamental problems, or contribute thereto, but to do so together with like-minded others in a shared enterprise leading to informed consensus." (p. 232) According to Schellenberg, RCP's refusal to offer positive reasons for its position disqualifies it from being philosophy because it cannot offer a shared enterprise that leads to informed consensus. In order to reach an informed consensus, there must be sharable reasons for thinking that Christianity is true. Since RCP presupposes the truth of Christianity, Schellenberg thinks it is best understood as theology and not philosophy. This is not to say that RCP lacks intellectual merit. Rather, his point is merely that RCP does not count as philosophy. In reply to Schellenberg's argument, Hasker maintains that hardly any major philosophical school of thought could satisfy the 'consensus' requirement in the communal condition. After all, philosophers are a contentious bunch, and often presuppose many things in their arguments. Thus, Hasker thinks that the communal condition is too restrictive for what counts as philosophy.

Graham Oppy's "Philosophy, Religion, and Worldview" takes aim at the narrative that contemporary Christian philosophers often tell. According to Plantinga and others, philosophy in the 1940's and 50's was hostile to religion, but there has been a resurgence in recent years; perhaps something of a golden age of philosophy of religion. Oppy is somewhat sceptical that things were really so hostile in earlier generations, and offers several lines of reasons to support his scepticism. For example, Oppy points out that 91 percent of the general US population in 1953 claimed to be Christian. He wonders if the philosophical community in America could really have been so hostile to religion in those days. Another example from Oppy is that universities like Harvard and Princeton had philosophers on staff who were interested in religious topics. He also considers the question "what is philosophy?" According to Oppy, philosophy is a discipline that addresses questions that have not yet established a method for producing consensus answers. He also expresses worries that contemporary philosophy of religion is too narrowly focused on Christianity, and calls for philosophers to consider other religious perspectives. In response, Hasker finds Oppy's evidence from the 1950's to be underdetermined at best. Hasker concedes that Christian philosophers should accept the challenge to consider other worldviews.

The final essay is Peter Ochs' "Beyond Two-Valued Logics: A Jewish Philosopher's Take on Recent Trends in Christian Philosophy." Ochs expresses excitement at the growth in Christian philosophy because it opens up space for Jewish philosophy. Yet he thinks that the Plantinga-style approach to philosophy of religion unnecessarily assumes a two-valued logic. This is where all propositions have a truth-value of true or false. Ochs wants philosophers to be open to multivalued logical systems. He claims that Christian thinkers like the apostle Paul, Origen, and Augustine held to a multivalued logic; thus there is precedent within Christian thought. Ochs thinks that a multivalued logic would be a useful area of exploration within philosophy of religion, so he offers several arguments in favour of a multivalued logic. One argument pertains to statements about the future. If the future does not exist, then one might be justified in saying that propositions about the future are neither true nor false. Other arguments he offers focus on prayer, semantic shifts in language, and quantum mechanics. In his response chapter, Hasker is fairly positive regarding Ochs' position. While Hasker expresses doubt about some of the arguments that Ochs puts forward, he is quite positive about philosophers of religion exploring multivalued logics.

Personally, I found the essays in this volume to be engaging, and of general interest to Christian philosophers. Some of them would be useful material for courses on Christian philosophy, philosophical theology, or philosophy of religion. I greatly appreciate the attempt to bring analytic and continental thinkers together in a charitable way to discuss topics of common interest. Upon finishing this volume, I was left wondering what the future of Christian philosophy will look like in 10 years. Will Christian philosophy continue to follow Plantinga's advice, or will it need to seek new advice as it faces different challenges?