Christian Philosophy of Religion: Essays in Honor of Stephen T. Davis

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C. P. Ruloff (ed.), Christian Philosophy of Religion: Essays in Honor of Stephen T. Davis, University of Notre Dame Press, 2015, 374pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268040376.

Reviewed by Eric O. Springsted, The Center of Theological Inquiry, Princeton


This festschrift dedicated to Stephen T. Davis is a handsome and wide-reaching tribute by many of the most esteemed members of Davis' guild in the philosophy of religion. Davis' own four decade career has been a prolific one, and his many contributions have been important ones. His writings have spanned a wide range of topics -- the Bible, the problem of evil, reason and belief, for example. But what perhaps he is best known for his his deliberate crossing of the lines that many think separate philosophy and theology. Philosophically, he has been an apologist for Christianity and religious belief. But he also taken on topics with philosophical treatment that are specifically theological, with hoped for theological results.

Given Davis' own interests, it is no surprise that a festschrift dedicated to him would be just as wide ranging. In order to give some order, it is divided into four sections: "Doctrine and Christian Belief," "The Nature of God and Christian Belief," "Reason and Christian Belief," and "Scripture, Theology, and Christian Belief." With the exception of three essays that had been previously published, all are original. Still, as is the case with many festschriften, there is no single focus of the book other than perhaps the tribute to Davis' own wide ranging interests. Some of the essays seek to engage directly Davis' contributions to the field, but most are, in his honor, making their own contributions to the field. While that range defies any easily apparent way to deal with this volume as a whole, it perhaps does, in its very diversity, raise as an example some important questions about the field and its unity and even what it is trying to do.

In this regard, the short essay by Gerald O'Collins, SJ ("The Philosophical Theology of Stephen Davis: Does It Coincide with Fundamental Theology?") at the end of the book is the place to start. O'Collins, borrowing from John Macquarrie, distinguishes appropriately between philosophical theology, which requires faith, and the philosophy of religion which does not. On this definition, O'Collins notes that much of Davis' work has been in philosophical theology. It is not so much about religion as it seeks to be a contribution to a believer's understanding of his or her religion. O'Collins then goes on to look at the field of Fundamental Theology, a field that has long been important in Roman Catholic thought. It, too, is an attempt of faith seeking understanding, and it, too, has both an apologetic and doctrinal function. It gives a way to understand certain basic questions of the Christian faith. After a brief survey of these issues and Davis' writings, O'Collins suggests that there is indeed a partial convergence and that there should be a further dialogue.

That suggestion and invitation can be a way to examine the approaches of the rest of the contributions to this volume. Indeed, it provides an entry to some deep questioning about the relation of philosophy and theology by so many of the practitioners who have contributed to this volume and the many who follow them and which is well represented by journals such as Faith and Philosophy. It has long seemed to me that that relation has never been clear and that it is getting less clear rather than more. This is not so much a matter of a tension that arises because one is trying to bring philosophical clarity and argument into the religious sphere as it is a problem about the way that the subject matter of belief gets treated in the first place. What I have in mind is that a great deal of apologetic writing and writing philosophically on doctrines seems to get done without actually engaging what believers are really doing, and what they have been doing for a very long time, or even what they meant when doctrines were first formulated.

On this account, let me cite what I think is one of the best and most interesting essays in the volume, Linda Zagzebski's "Faith and Testimony." Zagzebski distinguishes between theoretical reasons, which are "logically or probabilistically connected to the truth of p," third person reasons, and deliberative reasons which are first person reasons. Trust in others is an example of the second. Such reasons are essentially connected to belief, but they are also epistemic reasons and directed to truth. She then goes on to argue that faith in God is a matter of trusting God, and it often comes about by trusting witnesses and testifiers. There are all sorts of good reasons, as well as bad reasons, to trust witnesses. But the important point is that they are directed to reasons for me to believe what the speaker is saying. Theoretical reasons do not touch these reasons. And in this regard, she notes, theoretical reasoning can only argue to the fact that the evidence is good or bad for belief (Locke) or that if belief is justified because it is properly basic (Plantinga.) But that is still not why I believe. Deliberative reasons are why I believe. The distinction is important, and Zagzebski has written a very nice piece on it. But her point is also methodologically wide ranging and can be used to divide the way that philosophy and religion come together even when the practitioners in question are all believers and all philosophers.

In this case, the difference is not so much about whether the author is a believer or not (in this volume all are, I presume). It is more a difference between philosophers who are looking at what believers do and how they come to it and those who are arguing a position in itself, without any close examination of how this actually connects to the phenomenon and grammar of religious belief. In the case of the latter, as my old teacher and colleague, Diogenes Allen, once put it, you begin to realize that while the argument is getting increasingly heated, it is all the while being fought out at the fence; you are never getting anywhere close to the house where the people actually live. Now, that is perhaps a good defensive strategy, but it is in the end not a matter of faith seeking understanding. In that case, it is a matter of a certain kind of apologetics; it may well show that critics do not have a knock down case and thus there is space for belief, although without needing to say how belief fills it in. I think Plantinga's justly celebrated work on the problem of evil is an example. It does show that the classic problem of evil, as Hume and many others argued it, does not logically make Christian belief impossible. But it does not show how Christians actually deal with evil. In this respect, it is not really philosophical theology.

I have cited Zagzebski's article as a good example of a philosopher actually clarifying belief. It has the added virtue of pointing one to the place she should be looking if she really wants to understand belief. Hers is not the only article that does this. The articles by Anselm K. Min on divine immutability and God's ability to love, Kelly James Clark's on narrative, and C. Stephen Evans' on moral arguments for God, are also good examples and show in varying degrees that one does not have to forsake philosophical sophistication while dealing with the believer's actual reasons.

That much has chiefly to do with the relation of reason and Christian belief. But it can be extended to the way that doctrines have been treated by believing philosophers, a project of the last generation and one to which Davis made many contributions. The project can be an important one, but it can also be a wildly self indulgent one as well and sometimes highly misleading. For example, William Hasker's essay on the Trinity, "How to Think about the Trinity," while highly ingenious in arguing philosophically for "social Trinitarianism," also commits the theological methodological error of not bothering to any great degree to examine what was meant by the doctrine in its original and transmitted formulation. He does give (albeit cursorily) what he says is the Fathers' reading of New Testament passages such as "The Father and I are one." He quickly concludes that the "relationship between Jesus and the Father is undeniably a personal relationship, in the full sense of the term." As he goes on, "the full sense of the term" seems to involve a sense of the person that is largely modern and Personalist. When he further suggests that St. Augustine "committed himself to precisely the social Trinitarian doctrine" I am afraid he is just plain wrong. While Augustine did work out ways to talk about the "persons" of the Trinity, the fact of the matter is that he also thought that the term "person" was misleading and therefore unfortunate. That is to say, while he thought there was a relation between the members of the Trinity, he did not think it was a "personal relationship in the full sense of the term." Or, if it was, it was a sense that belonged to God and that we have not understand very well at all, and what we take "personal relationship" to be needs serious revision. But he really would have liked another term.

So, there is a lot of historical theology that has been ignored here, and that is very frequently, as far as I can tell, a problem that has continually beset the project of treating doctrines with analytic philosophy even when it has been sympathetic, as it is here. The sense that words and concepts have historical contexts is not taken into consideration often enough. In this regard, an examination of some of the extensive recent historical and contemporary theological work on this issue, such as in the recent volume Rethinking Trinitarian Theology: Disputed Questions and Contemporary Issues, which does examine what terms such as "person" and "relation" have meant in Christian doctrine without begging the conclusion on social Trinitarianism, would have been a salutary exercise.

On the other hand, sometimes the project has done this valuable work, and this volume witnesses to that stream as well. For example, Eleonore Stump's essay on the doctrine of divine simplicity in Aquinas is masterful in showing what Aquinas' issues and explications were when discussing divine simplicity, and she shows their ongoing importance. I would also commend Min's essay on the immutability of God. Rather than being baffled by the apparent contradiction between God's immutability and the apparent need to be mutable in order to love, at least love reciprocally, Min shows insight into what immutability has always meant to say -- that it is God's fullness of being, which cannot be added to or subtracted from, that allows God to "love us, relate to us, and suffer with us in a way that simply transcends the way we can ever love, relate to, and suffer for another". The key is, and this is the key to doing Christian theology proper, that Min is able, via an examination of Aquinas, to use the doctrine of immutability to develop an ontology of divine love and hence to say something significant about what love is in the Christian tradition. That is important because, deep down, the word may not in Jesus' mouth mean quite what we mean when we use it. In this regard, he lets theology, as it should, upset our common understandings. Solving the problem may well depend upon what you understand the problem to be.

I cite Allen once again. He characterized the field of philosophy of religion as one that is not originary but rather one that arose because there is body of literature that is the result of philosophers writing on religious topics and theologians writing philosophically. The field is the investigation of this crossover literature. It is to the credit of philosophers of religion such as Davis that they have sought to say something important to faith as a result of having examined and argued about this body of literature. But the project is one that still needs focus, and as a project of philosophical theology, it perhaps above all needs to figure out whether its audience is in the final analysis other philosophers, which is fine, or whether it is actually making a contribution to faith seeking understanding.