Christianity, Truth, and Weakening Faith: A Dialogue

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Gianni Vattimo and René Girard, Christianity, Truth, and Weakening Faith: A Dialogue, Pierpaolo Antonello (ed.), William McCuaig (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2010, 124 pp, $18.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231148283.

Reviewed by Kevin Hart, The University of Virginia/The Australian Catholic University


Gianni Vattimo is best known today, at least in the English-speaking world, as one of a triad of European philosophers whose names are often on the lips of a general audience, one existing largely outside Philosophy Departments in the United States. The other two are Georgio Agamben and Slavoj Žižek. These three writers do not constitute a school, and perhaps there is little that binds them together except a shared background in nineteenth- and twentieth-century European philosophy. Agamben draws from Heidegger and Benjamin; Žižek elaborates on Lacan; and Vattimo develops from Nietzsche and Luigi Pareyson. Each has a far broader philosophical and artistic culture than is usual in the English-speaking philosophical world. What allows their names to be linked in North American conversations is a willingness to engage in discussions of the nature and future of Christianity and to offer commentary on contemporary political events. So Agamben writes a gloss on Paul's epistle to the Romans, The Time that Remains (2005), reflects on homo sacer, and speaks out against America's response to 9/11. Žižek, a declared atheist, nonetheless figures Christianity as a partner in the quest for social egalitarianism and is a frequent spokesman on contemporary political events. His joint book with theologian John Milbank, The Monstrosity of Christ (2009), is a recent instance of his engagement with Christianity. And Vattimo, now on more intimate terms with the Catholic Church, has recently written a number of short books -- interventions and dialogues, really -- on Christianity, while also offering insights into contemporary politics. From 1999-2004 he was a member of the European parliament.

It is fair to say that neither of the stricter schools of philosophy today thinks well of this triad. Phenomenologists tend to regard all three as of passing interest, for they lack the clarity and rigor made available by reduction, and only the hermeneutical dimension of their work calls for attention. Analytic philosophers, especially the more hard-boiled sort, usually have little more than barely disguised contempt for them, unless, of course, they are drawn to Europeans' diagnoses of political events, in which case their strength is held to be in the realm of cultural commentary, not philosophy in the narrow sense. Yet the triad clearly seeks to fill a vast cultural space: many people outside the world of professional philosophy need to hear intelligent analysis of politics and religion, not least of all when they are felt to be entwined. Whether the discussion is intelligent is one question; whether it is desired is another. That it is desired is readily apparent: a big publishing house such as Columbia University Press does not repeatedly commit large amounts of money to publishing authors whose books do not sell, especially in a recession. Whether that desire is whipped up by people wanting to follow authors who have been made fashionable by the media, or whether it is a genuine desire on their part to rethink the future of Christian faith is more difficult to distinguish with any confidence. One thing is for sure: analytic philosophers are not entering the space of popular intellectual culture to issue any challenge, and while phenomenologists sometimes take a step or two into that space it is mostly in highly determined circumstances: the world of Catholicism, for example.

Gianni Vattimo (b. 1936) studied in Turin under Pareyson (1918-91), a fecund and creative philosopher whose strengths were in aesthetics and hermeneutics. Only a brief selection of Pareyson's work has been translated, and there is need for an English version of his Estetica: Teoria della formatività (1954), among other works.[1] Much of Vattimo's most significant writing has been, like Pareyson's, in aesthetics and hermeneutics, both broadly understood, and inflected by an enduring engagement with Nietzsche and those who have followed in his wake: Heidegger, Derrida, and Rorty being prominent among them. Intellectual pedigree tells us only so much, though. We need to know what sort of philosopher he is, and what he does best, if we are to do justice to his work.

There are different things to prize in philosophers: original concepts, diagnoses of problems, rigorous arguments, re-descriptions of the world, and so on. Sometimes a philosopher is memorable for one or more original concepts, though not at the time (or later) for any arguments to do with them. And so with variations on the list I have given. Think only of modern instances. Pareyson's intriguing concept of formativity is more winning than his arguments for it. Wittgenstein can be breathtaking in his diagnoses of philosophical problems but does not re-describe the world effectively. Frege offers rigorous arguments but is no diagnostician. Heidegger re-describes the world in Sein und Zeit but overlooks counter-examples that would make his case more compelling. Some philosophers bequeath problems (Descartes, say), while others contribute to their possible solution (Husserl, for example). Derrida is an outstanding reader of philosophical texts, although he added very little to the standard repertoire of philosophical questions and answers. If we turn to Vattimo while keeping in mind this generous understanding of excellence in philosophy and then ask ourselves what he does best, our most charitable answer would be that he comes up with a concept: pensiero debole. In Italian debole can mean anything from "weak" or "feeble" to "dull" or "ineffective." For Vattimo, the two words are best rendered in English as "weak thought" or "weakening thought" or even "softening thought."

Weak thought is a consequence of what Nietzsche diagnosed as nihilism. Vattimo draws a thread from Nietzsche: "Since Copernicus man has been rolling from the center towards X."[2] For Vattimo, this indicates "the situation in which the human subject explicitly recognizes that the lack of foundation is a constitutive part of its condition (what Nietzsche elsewhere calls 'the death of God')."[3] Now it must be said that Nietzsche's account of European nihilism is far more complex than Vattimo suggests; it incorporates many motifs, including pessimism, the status of the question "Why?," and a critique of Christian morality. The line that Vattimo quotes indicates that human beings no longer occupy the center of the cosmos, exist without a God fully decked out with what Gilson called "the metaphysics of Exodus," are without a firm center in rationality or virtue, and so forth. To this view Vattimo adds another trait of nihilism that he takes from Heidegger's commentary on Nietzsche: "The essence of nihilism is the history in which there is nothing to Being itself."[4] This would be what Heidegger calls "passive nihilism" in Nietzsche, a history of decline, and not the "active nihilism" that he links to the eternal return of the same.[5] Vattimo deems nihilism conceived as the evacuation of Being to lead to Heidegger's conception of Andenken as distinct from metaphysics constituted as onto-theio-logy. Taken together, then, weak thought is what comes about when we construe human being as without any ground -- cosmological, epistemological, ontological, or ethical -- and at the end of a history in which all variations of being, including being as the will to power, have been played out.

Accordingly, weak thought affirms incompleteness in philosophy and embraces the principle that a plurality of views may be adopted with respect to any position. Vattimo agrees with Nietzsche when he writes against the positivists, "No, facts are precisely what there is not, only interpretations."[6] No counter-examples are entertained when Vattimo embraces this claim, and so we must assume that for him the statement "The philosopher Gianni Vattimo was born in 1936" is an interpretation, not a fact. I suppose that "1936" might be ventured as an interpretation of a temporal sequence, though it would seem to be an interpretation of a rather trivial sort. At any rate, regarding logic, epistemology, and metaphysics as absolute grounds, and without showing any interest in other non-foundational philosophies, Vattimo endorses philosophy as edifying and pragmatic in orientation and as rhetorical and hermeneutic in practice.[7] He thereby gains an ally in Richard Rorty.[8] Weak thought cannot affirm Überwindung, overcoming metaphysics as onto-theio-logy, but must content itself with Verwindung, a gradual uncoiling from it by way of style, irony, and soft religious belief. Presumably, it is the stress on Verwindung that excuses Vattimo from working within a sharp binary ("strong / weak") that would be metaphysical according to his own principles. Yet Vattimo is not a tidy thinker: he borrows what he likes from Nietzsche and Heidegger and does not put pressure on his own formulations. On Vattimo's own terms it remains obscure why we should accept weak thought rather than old-style metaphysics. After all, what justifies his interpretation of the history of modern philosophy and makes it persuasive?

As a concept, "weak thought" belongs to Vattimo only by a thread; it is common in modern non-foundational philosophy, though it goes by different names and is usually more intellectually compelling. At a stretch, one might figure weak thought as a far less rich and demanding version of part of what Derrida called deconstruction. Among other things, weak thought is without the quasi-transcendental play of la difference -- which Vattimo would think too indulgent with respect to post-Kantian thought -- and also without the concomitant hyperbolic affirmation of the Other. However, where Derrida is severe, Vattimo is mostly relaxed and even popularist; where Derrida is a slow reader, with an eye for telling details, Vattimo skims quickly over difficulties and tends to exaggerate for effect; and where Derrida is boldly original, even with respect to Heidegger, Vattimo is derivative.[9] Perhaps, though, Vattimo can distinguish himself in his account of Christianity. For Derrida was not at his best when offering himself as a philosopher of religion. Much of his oft-cited essay "Faith and Knowledge" does little more than re-launch nineteenth-century Protestant liberalism with insights and vocabulary coming from Blanchot and Lévinas. Nonetheless, his long reflection on apophatic theology, "How to Avoid Speaking," is consistently interesting and valuable, even if it completely overlooks the contribution of Gregory of Nyssa in his Against Eunomius and his homilies on the Canticle.[10] What then does Vattimo have to say about Christianity?

Certainly Vattimo is against revelation and transcendence, for he maintains that they are violent insofar as they close off questioning.[11] (Yet Christian theologians can hardly be said to have stopped thinking in highly creative ways, even when faced with a canon of Scripture and a range of creeds. The infinite God calls forth endless thought.) Vattimo is against the God of Aquinas -- ipsum esse subsistens omnibus modis indeterminatum -- because He is "the summation in pre-eminent form of all the characters of objective being as thought by metaphysics."[12] (Yet Aquinas's God falls outside distinctions between subject and object: He is not defined with respect to the world and is not one of its objects.) Vattimo also holds that the weakening of Christian metaphysics leads to a softening of faith. So Christianity is itself the cause of the secularization it opposes today, especially in Europe.[13] (The opposition between Christianity and secularization, tied as it is here to a supposed "essence" of Christianity, is more complex than Vattimo allows; many motifs of the "secular" are precisely Christian values that, far from being held weakly, are supported with various sorts of strength: ethical, economic, intellectual, legal, military.) He concedes that he believes in belief, though what he believes, and on what grounds, is hard to say. He is reluctant to specify a fides quæ, and yet without one a fides qua is mostly empty and aimless. What he seems to have faith in is a Christianity in which he finds "the original 'text' of which weak ontology is the transcription," namely a vision of kénōsis.[14] Such is the basis of his re-interpretation of Christianity, which for Vattimo is always and already a catena of interpretations, and which forms the basis for his dialogue with the eminent anthropologist René Girard.

Paul's teaching of kénōsis, Vattimo argues, is the motor of the "desacralizing thrust of Christianity"; and he calls for support from Hegel and Dilthey on the incarnation and humiliation of Christ.[15] To this view, he adds John 15:15 ("Henceforth I call you not servants. . . but I have called you friends"). [16] The link between kénōsis and friendship with God thus becomes the means for dismissing divine transcendence and sovereignty, which for Vattimo are figures of violence, a view that is declared rather than carefully justified. (For Vattimo, even specifying a birth date would presumably be an act of violence.) Now it must be pointed out that Paul is concerned with the incarnation and humiliation of Christ, not the Father: this is the teaching of kénōsis, in which the Second Person of the Trinity offers Himself to the Father's will, becoming obedient to finitude and death in order to bring about the salvation of human beings. There is no sense in which God as such weakens Himself, softens metaphysical grounds, and thereby serves as the basis for not accepting ultimate truths, certainty in thought, or even the authority of the Church. The friendship that Christ offers is to those who believe in Him as the Christ. It is belief, not believing in belief. It should also be pointed out that Paul speaks not only of kénōsis but also of epektasis. Christians are to be like Christ in freely accepting sacrifice and death, and like Christ we are to stretch ourselves into the eternal love of God. "God can only be a relativist" (52), Vattimo proposes, since otherwise those who have not heard the Gospel, or learned of the Trinity, cannot be saved. But is it not possible, as Karl Rahner contends, that all may be saved in and through Christ, even if they do not utter explicit acts of faith in Him? The salvation of non-Christians turns on the power and generosity of divine Grace, not on the weakness of God.

Vattimo testifies that he has been led back to Christianity in part by Girard's insight that Jesus is not the "immaculate victim" of human violence who thereby becomes sacralized but someone who explodes that paradigm. He summarizes Of Things Hidden Since the Foundation of the World (1987):

Girard argues, with good reason, that this victim-based reading of Scripture is wrong. Jesus' incarnation did not take place to supply a victim adequate to his wrath; rather, Jesus came into the world precisely to reveal and abolish the nexus between violence and the sacred.[17]

Girard's analysis is of deep interest for theologians working on the Atonement. Yet it seems to me that Vattimo's attempt to recode Girard's insights by way of his weak version of the end of metaphysics clouds something important. What we see in the life, preaching, suffering, death, and resurrection of Jesus is not the beginning of the softening of metaphysics. We see, rather, that the affirmation of the Kingdom produces a contradiction with the world, a world that is fallen and violent, and that this affirmation leads to the cross. And we see too that the resurrection is a vindication of Jesus's preaching of the Kingdom: it reveals that it is not just one more philosophy but is the way to live that is truly pleasing to God. Theologians and philosophers of religion may learn from Girard, but Vattimo encumbers him with help.

[1] See Luigi Pareyson, Existence, Interpretation, Freedom: Selected Writings, ed. and intro. Paolo Diego Bubbio, trans. Anna Mattei (Aurora, CO: The Davies Group, 2009).

[2] Friedrich Nietzsche, The Will to Power, trans. Walter Kaufmann and R. J. Hollingdale, ed. Walter Kaufmann (New York: Vintage Books, 1968), 8.

[3] Gianni Vattimo, The End of Modernity: Nihilism and Hermeneutics in Postmodern Culture, trans. and intro. Jon R. Snyder (Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1988), 118.

[4] Vattimo, The End of Modernity, 118. Vattimo (or his American editor) refers us to Martin Heidegger, Nietzsche, II: The Eternal Recurrence of the Same, trans. David Farrell Krell (San Francisco: Harper and Row, 1984), though without a page number. He seems to be thinking of the passage I have quoted that may be found in Nietzsche, IV: Nihilism, trans. Frank A. Capuzzi, ed. David Farrell Krell (San Francisco: Harper and Row, 1982), 201.

[5] See Heidegger, Nietzsche, IV, 55.

[6] Nietzsche, The Will to Power, 267. Slightly modified translation.

[7] On rhetoric, understood as speaking ad homines, see Vattimo, The Responsibility of the Philosopher, ed. Franca d'Agostini, trans. William McCuaig (New York: Columbia University Press, 2010), 69.

[8] See Richard Rorty and Gianni Vattimo, The Future of Religion, ed. Santiago Zabala (New York: Columbia University Press, 2005).

[9] For Vattimo's philosophical popularism, see The Responsibility of the Philosopher, 113.

[10] See Jacques Derrida, "Faith and Knowledge: The Two Sources of 'Religion' at the Limits of Reason Alone," trans. Samuel Weber, Religion, ed. Jacques Derrida and Gianni Vattimo (Cambridge: Polity Press, 1998), 1-78, and "How to Avoid Speaking: Denials," trans. Ken Frieden and Elizabeth Rottenberg, Psyche: Inventions of the Other, II, ed. Peggy Kamuf and Elizabeth Rottenberg (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008), 143-95.

[11] See on this theme, Vattimo, Belief, trans. Luca d'Isanto and David Webb (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1999), 65.

[12] Vattimo, Belief, 39. See Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiæ, 1a, q. 11, art. 4 responsio.

[13] See Vattimo, After Christianity, trans. Luca d'Isanto (New York: Columbia University Press, 2002), ch. 5, and Belief, 50-54.

[14] Vattimo, Belief, 70.

[15] Vattimo, Christianity, Truth, and Weakening Faith, 48. Also see, After Christianity, 91.

[16] See, for example, Vattimo, Belief, 26.

[17] Vattimo, Belief, 37.