Cicero, On Academic Scepticism

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Cicero, On Academic Scepticism, (translated, with introduction and notes by, Charles Brittain), Hackett Publishing Company, 2006, 224pp., $12.95 (pbk), ISBN 0872207749.

Reviewed by Casey Perin, University of Massachusetts at Amherst


This volume contains a translation of the extant portions of Cicero's Academica. The translation is preceded by an introduction that surveys the historical and philosophical contexts of Cicero's work on Academic scepticism and discusses some of the special problems involved in translating Cicero's Latin into readable English for a philosophical audience. There is also an analytical table of contents for the Academica, a select topical bibliography, a brief textual appendix, an extensive glossary of names, a select English-Latin-Greek glossary, and a full index. It is an impressive book, and will be immensely useful to anyone working on, and so struggling with, the Academica and the complex history of Academic scepticism. On Academic Scepticism will also make Cicero's Academica accessible to those who do not read Latin and are not specialists in Hellenistic philosophy.

Cicero's Academica appeared in two editions. The first edition consisted of two books: the lost Catulus and the extant Lucullus (sometimes called the 'Academica Priora' and usually referred to as 'Acad. 2' because it is the second book of the first edition). A revised second edition consisted of four books of which only half of Book 1 (sometimes called the 'Academica Posteriora' and usually referred to as 'Acad. 1' because it is the first book of the second edition) and a small number of fragments from this and the other three books survive. Brittain's translation of this material is exemplary. It is particularly sensitive to certain important idiosyncratic features of Cicero's text. The Academica, as Brittain explains in his introduction (xl-xliii), is itself at least in part a work of translation: Cicero is presenting in Latin a body of Greek philosophical material and doing so requires him to craft Latin translations for a range of technical Greek terms. He is not always particularly successful, and it is tempting for a translator to correct his errors. This is a temptation that Brittain rightly resists. So, for instance, and as Brittain notes, Cicero ignores the distinction drawn by the Stoics between (i) an impression that provides us with knowledge (katalêpsis -- which Brittain translates as 'apprehension') of an object or state of affairs and (ii) the object or state of affairs of which we have knowledge. A 'cataleptic' impression is not itself something of which we have knowledge but rather, as the active Greek adjective 'cataleptic' (katalêptikê) indicates, something in virtue of which we have knowledge of an object or state of affairs. Cicero, however, systematically describes not only objects or states of affairs, but also impressions, as things of which we have knowledge (Acad 2.18, 2.77, 2.112-113). He thereby distorts the Stoic material he is presenting, and Brittain's translation preserves this distortion.

In this respect Brittain's translation is different from, and more accurate than, the translation of the relevant passages from the Academica found in Long and Sedley's sourcebook The Hellenistic Philosophers (Cambridge University Press, 1987). At Acad 2.77, for example, Cicero writes:

hic Zenonem vidisse acute nullum esse visum quod percipi posset si… .

which Long and Sedley (1.242 = 40D) translate as

At this point Zeno was sharp enough to see that if … there was no cognitive impression.

The phrase 'cognitive impression', however, is a plausible translation not of Cicero's visum quod percipi posset but rather of the Greek phrase katalêptikê phantasia. Long and Sedley's rendering of Cicero's Latin masks the fact that Cicero here treats an impression (visum) as itself something which can be known or apprehended, that is, something of which one can have katalêpsis. But that this is so is perfectly clear in Brittain's translation:

At this point Zeno was sharp enough to see that no impression would be apprehensible if …

Why does Cicero, unlike the Stoics whose doctrine he is presenting, describe an impression as something that can be known -- as something, in Brittain's translation, "apprehensible"? At Acad. 1.41, as both Long and Sedley (2.244) and Brittain (xlii and 104 n.52) note, Cicero gives us comprehendibile (literally 'capable of being grasped') as a translation not of the active Greek adjective katalêptikê but of the passive adjective katalêpton. Here again, however, Brittain's English is closer to Cicero's Latin: he renders comprehendibile by 'apprehensible' where Long and Sedley translate it by 'cognitive' -- the translation they and others use for the active form katalêptikê.

Brittain's introduction (along with his copious notes to the translation) is especially good on the historical context of Cicero's Academica. According to Brittain, one reason for the undue neglect to which the Academica has been subject in modern times is the complexity of the work itself. That complexity, in turn, is in part the result of Cicero's attempt to present what Brittain calls "the rather complicated and controversial evolution of the sceptical Academy" (viii). For the Academica ranges over not one but two major philosophical debates in antiquity, and each of these debates had several distinct stages or phases. Since these debates are not always easy to track in the extant portions of the Academica, Brittain provides in his introduction a valuable chronological sketch of them (xiii-xiv). The first debate is the one conducted by the Stoics and Academics in the third and second centuries BCE over the possibility and conditions of knowledge. The second debate was a dispute among Academics in the first century BCE over the status and proper form of scepticism. This debate is considerably more obscure than the first, and so its details are more controversial. Some Academics (Clitomachus) advocated a radical form of scepticism, other Academics (Philo of Larissa, at least for a time) adopted a mitigated form of scepticism, and still other Academics (Antiochus and in the end, apparently, Philo) abandoned scepticism. Brittain explains clearly how the positions of Cicero's Roman interlocutors in the two editions of the Academica align with the views of the Greek philosophers involved in the Stoic-Academic and the intra-Academic debates.

The material of greatest philosophical significance in the Academica concerns the debate between the Stoics and Academics over the possibility of knowledge and its implications for the rationality of assent and the conditions of action. In his introduction Brittain outlines the Stoic doctrine of 'cataleptic' impressions and what he calls the "core" Academic argument against this doctrine, but his discussion is at certain important points obscure. This is so in part because the terminology he uses to explicate the Stoic doctrine of 'cataleptic' impressions is obscure. He talks of "the phenomenal content" (xxi-xxii) of an impression without making it clear just what this might be -- though, given that he also talks with respect to impressions of "the inimitable richness and detail of the representation" (xx), the "phenomenal content" of an impression must be at least in part a matter of the properties that impression represents its object as having. More confusing still is Brittain's remark about cataleptic impressions that "The content of such impressions represents their objects so accurately that it could not be mimicked or reduplicated… " (xxi). Here, curiously, it is not an impression that represents something but its content that does so. This just seems to confuse the thing that does the representing (an impression) with what it represents as being the case (its content).

The Academics argued that no impression satisfies the Stoic definition of a 'cataleptic' impression and, therefore, that there are no 'cataleptic' impressions. In making this argument the Academics appealed principally to two sets of considerations: the existence of what Brittain calls "metaphysically indiscernible -- or, at any rate, experientially indiscriminable -- objects" (xxi) (e.g. twins, a pair of eggs, etc.) and the existence of certain abnormal states of mind, e.g. dreams and madness. It is far from clear, either in our sources (including the Academica) or in Brittain's introduction, just how these considerations are supposed to support the conclusion that no impression satisfies the Stoic definition of a 'cataleptic' impression. The Academic appeal to "indiscriminable" objects is especially puzzling. Brittain writes with respect to such objects that "Any one of these, [the Academics] argued, could be mistaken for another, no matter how good or accurate one's impression of it was" (xxi). The Stoics can easily concede, however, that if two objects A and B (Socrates and his twin, two eggs, etc.) are in fact "indiscriminable" -- that is, if A and B are so similar that whatever differences they do exhibit cannot be captured by any human impression -- then no impression of A or of B is a 'cataleptic' impression. But in conceding this much the Stoics need not concede, and it is not easy to see how the Academics have given them any reason to concede, that for any object A there is in fact a second object B that is "indiscriminable" from A and, therefore, that for any object A, no impression of A is a 'cataleptic' impression. Brittain describes the Academic appeal to "indiscriminable" objects as an appeal to "the indiscriminability (aparallaxia) of true and false (or, more accurately, of cataleptic and noncataleptic) impressions" (xxii). But, first, this characterization of the Academic appeal to "indiscriminable" objects is inaccurate.[1] For the Academics do not argue that there are 'non-cataleptic' impressions that are "indiscriminable" from 'cataleptic' impressions. They argue that there are no 'cataleptic' impressions. Second, Brittain does not explain, nor even raise as a possible interpretative issue, how the Academic appeal to "indiscriminable" objects can support a conclusion with the required generality -- how, that is, it can support the conclusion that no impression is a 'cataleptic' impression rather than the weaker conclusion, compatible with Stoic doctrine, that some impressions are not 'catalpetic'.

Brittain's discussion (xxiii-xxxi) of the Stoic apraxia or 'inactivity' argument, and of the philosophical options with which it leaves the Academics, is much better. These options, as Brittain explains, dictate the different forms Academic scepticism assumed after Arcesilaus and Carneades. The Academics had argued

(A) There are no 'cataleptic' impressions.

According to the Stoics

(B) It is not rational to assent to a 'non-cataleptic' impression.

It follows, the Academics argued, that

(C) It is not rational to assent to any impression.

The Stoics offered what Brittain calls "a practical reductio" (xxv) of this Academic argument. If (C) were correct, action would be impossible. For, the Stoics claimed, action requires assent to impressions. This argument leaves the Academics with three options:

(I) Reject the Stoic claim that action requires assent.

(II) Accept the Stoic claim that action requires assent, but reject the Stoic claim (B) that it is not rational to assent to a 'non-cataleptic' impression, and so reject (C).

(III) Accept the Stoic claim that action requires assent, but reject the original Academic conclusion (A) that there are no 'cataleptic' impressions, and so reject (C).

As Brittain explains, Clitomachus exercises option (I), Philo of Larissa and Metrodorus option (II), and, though the evidence is much less clear here, Philo in his lost Roman Books, (III). (A more detailed discussion of these different forms of Academic scepticism is available in chapters 2 and 3 of Brittain's excellent Philo of Larissa (Oxford, 2001).)

On Academic Scepticism is a splendid volume. Brittain's translation of the Academica is among the very best recent translations of an ancient philosophical text. This translation, together with the wealth of supplementary material Brittain provides, will allow readers who do not know Latin but are interested in the philosophical problems under discussion in the Academica to engage with Cicero's difficult text.

[1] Brittain may be relying here on Michael Frede's misleading remark (in "Stoics and Skeptics on Clear and Distinct Impressions," in his Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Minneapolis, 1987, 173) that the Academic appeal to "indiscriminable" objects is supposed to show that there are impressions "exactly like, or at least indistinguishable from, cognitive impressions in the way in which they represent their object."