Cicero on the Philosophy of Religion: On the Nature of the Gods and On Divination

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J. P. F. Wynne, Cicero on the Philosophy of Religion: On the Nature of the Gods and On Divination, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 308pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107070486.

Reviewed by Brad Inwood, Yale University


In recent decades Cicero's importance as a philosopher and as a participant in the development of ancient Greco-Roman philosophy has come to be appreciated more widely than perhaps at any time since the eighteenth century. J.P.F. Wynne's lucid, detailed and persuasive study of Cicero's philosophy of religion is part of this scholarly movement. Three assumptions have characterized the best recent work of this kind: that Cicero's Academic scepticism is a genuinely held philosophical position and needs to be treated as such; that Cicero has his own intellectual agenda beyond merely reporting information about the main Hellenistic philosophical schools; and that Cicero's handling of the dialogue form as a vehicle for philosophy is the result of a serious and largely successful creative literary plan. Wynne not only embraces all three of these positions but demonstrates in detail how they manifest themselves in the works studied and how they make possible superior interpretations of Cicero's dialogues on the philosophy of religion.

The most significant work on Cicero in recent years has focused on his sceptical Academic Books, on the ethics of On Ends and On Duties, and on parts of the Tusculan Disputations that deal with the Stoic theory of the passions. Wynne's book analyses in depth two dialogues that, as he persuasively argues, are part of a coordinated project in the philosophy of religion: On the Nature of the Gods and On Divination. His contention is that Cicero's philosophical project needs to be understood as his response to important issues for Roman religion in the first century BCE. He shows that it is inadequate to treat these works as mere sources of information about Stoic and Epicurean doctrines and the sceptical attacks on them. But contrary to what the book's title might suggest, it would be a mistake to suppose that Cicero is advancing wholly general arguments in a systematic philosophical treatment of religion. As Cicero often claims in his prefaces, he is writing for his own society (or at least its intellectual elite), addressing what he takes to be their intellectual needs. The way to see what is philosophically richest in these works is to keep the interpretation embedded in an understanding of the Roman elite culture of its day; in that respect this book will be of interest to students of Roman society as well as to its main audience, philosophers and historians of ancient philosophy.

Wynne's argument begins with a long and detailed account of Cicero's project as a philosophical writer and of the way that has been understood and misunderstood in modern scholarship (1-49). Readers prepared to take Wynne's word for the best way to approach the dialogues will be tempted to skip parts of the introduction, but that would be a mistake: there is much in the detailed discussion that needs to be digested. Focusing on what he calls the dialogues of the Late Sequence (written in the politically turbulent 40's BCE near the end of Cicero's career and life), Wynne refutes older, less sympathetic and less convincing approaches to the dialogues, especially the view that Cicero regularly followed closely a single source "for long stretches of prose and perhaps in whole speeches or even books" (19). Wynne provides a well-balanced assessment of the arguments for and against this view of Cicero's working methods (18-28), but decisively rejects it in favour of a more realistic account of his procedure as an author.

Wynne is careful at every stage to distinguish the stance of Cicero as author from that of Cicero as a character in his own works; too many readers assume that the character speaks for the author merely because they share a name. Wynne also emphasizes a literary feature of the dialogues seldom noted. In writing dialogues as he does, Cicero is reviving what were to him classical models of philosophical dialogue: Plato, Aristotle and Heraclides of Pontus. In the intervening 250 or so years serious philosophy was not commonly written in dialogue form but in treatises of various sorts. In reaching back to the founding masters of the genre, Cicero reasserts the importance of dialogue both for communicating to a wider readership and for emphasizing that what matters in a philosophical issue has many sides, is complex and often not readily settled in debate. Cicero is no Plato when it comes to literary genius, but he is exceptionally good at writing philosophical dialogue and Wynne brings this out well.[1]

To understand Cicero's project in On the Nature of the Gods and On Divination,[2] Roman religious practice must be clarified, which Wynne does with real authority in chapter 1. The key thing for the Romans was correct performance of religious acts (orthopraxy) rather than correct beliefs (orthodoxy). As a sceptic, Cicero is particularly well placed to tackle an issue where the truth about the nature of the gods and their activities is not the central focus. Cicero's aim is to help his readers to see the right attitude to take towards traditional practice. No speaker in the dialogues challenges the appropriateness of traditional practice, so the focus is on 'moderating' the attitude to be taken to the practice. Religious performance accompanied by wrong beliefs would be either impious or superstitious: impious if the practices are accompanied by the false (Epicurean) view that the gods simply don't care about human beings; superstitious if we think the gods are overly and laboriously concerned about the details of human life (272). As a sceptic, Cicero the author of course does not claim that he will uncover the truth about the gods. His expectation is that the dialogue's philosophical enquiry, with its arguments on both sides of the key issues, will induce suspension of judgment about the nature of the gods. His characters, though, including his own persona, do take stands on issues about the gods. Here is one place where one sees the payoff from careful distinction between the author's commitments and those of a character, even one who seems most likely to be his spokesperson.[3]

On Wynne's view the Central Question Cicero addresses is not whether gods exist but whether they care for us (60). This question was central for Cicero because, as part of the general upheaval of the late Republic, his society was re-examining its traditional religious practices, their intellectual foundations, and their historical roots. Unlike his contemporary Varro, who conducted a detailed historical examination of Roman religion, Cicero's "approach is to accept the performances [of Roman religion] as given by tradition, and then to supply from philosophical investigation intellectually rigorous ways to interpret those performances" (78). The dialogues' balanced arguments for and against Epicurean and Stoic views contribute to making "each religiously required performance an action [that is] neither superstitious nor impious by leading the religious actor to lack the false beliefs about the gods which would make the performance superstitious or impious" (72). But like Varro Cicero believed that traditional practices, when viewed in the proper light, were essential to the sense of community needed by any society. The interdependence of religion and social cohesion was always on Cicero's mind, a preoccupation that put Epicureanism, with its disinterested gods and instrumentalist view of social relations, quite clearly in the wrong. Stoicism, despite the sceptical arguments brought against its theology, provided an intellectual basis for intrinsically valuable social connections, which were an important concern for Cicero in a number of works, not just in the dialogues on religion.

The bulk of Wynne's book consists of detailed interpretation of the debates that play out across the three books of On the Nature of the Gods and the two books of On Divination. Epicurean theory is expounded and critiqued in book 1 of On the Nature of the Gods (chapter 2). The Stoic theory in book 2 and the Academic critique in book 3 are examined in chapter 3. The treatment of On Divination occupies chapters 4 and 5. The more generous treatment of divination is justified by the fact that such messaging from the gods to human beings is fundamental for the issue of whether and how the gods care for human beings and by the fact that On Divination has not been discussed as thoroughly in previous scholarship as On the Nature of the Gods. Wynne makes real progress in explaining On Divination by showing that it builds on the previous dialogue as part of the same project, with the character Quintus in book 1 developing a novel defense of the Stoic position on divination that responds to the criticisms levelled against the Chrysippean theory in On the Nature of the Gods. Wynne argues that the target audience for On Divination consists of learned readers who know the intellectual terrain already and that this explains several apparently anomalous features of the dialogue.

Wynne's analysis in chapter 4 of the methodology and underlying epistemology for the revised version of the Stoic theory of divination presented in book 1 is a high point in the book. Even readers with little patience for rational reconstructions of now defunct theories will find Wynne's sophisticated analysis rewarding. This paves the way for a treatment in chapter 5 of the response to the Stoic theory that is presented in book 2, where (contrary to the generally held view) Wynne shows that Cicero's goal is not to refute that theory but rather to "balance the case for divinatory phenomena as the decisive evidence" for the view that the gods care for human beings, "against the case that they offer no such evidence" (263).

In the final chapter Wynne reconciles his view that the author Cicero is a radical Academic sceptic with the obvious support his dialogues provide for the view that the gods do care for human beings. He rises to the challenge of reconciling the position of the character Cicero in On Divination 2 with the radical scepticism of Cicero the author. Cicero's view, Wynne shows, is that religious practice should be preserved and moderated, that is, regulated by the need to combine it with a philosophical (we might say 'scientific') understanding of nature. To support the view that the gods care for us we do not in the end need to believe that they send us detailed information through divination; the beauty and order of the natural world, plausibly though not dogmatically seen as a result of divine activity, are enough. Divination as the Stoics understood it, even in the revised version Cicero has Quintus present in book 1, is not good philosophy. There may well be cultural and social justifications for maintaining divinatory practices, but actually believing that divination predicts outcomes in the manner of empirical predictions would be rank superstition, the stance towards religious practice that Cicero's whole project aimed to avoid. This is what seems most like the truth to Cicero as he writes the dialogues, and to his character as he speaks in them; and it certainly suits the author's purpose in writing these dialogues, addressing the demands of the contemporary intellectual scene in his society.

No doubt some readers of Wynne's book will find Cicero's scepticism as portrayed here too slippery for comfort: it avoids taking a view on matters of fact but is comfortable saying what seems likeliest in a given context. But that worry is an endemic problem for any presentation of Academic scepticism, and Wynne can hardly be held responsible for problems in the theory he so convincingly recovers. Cicero's dialogues on religion present, I think, the most severe challenge to the understanding of Cicero as a consistent sceptic and Wynne has done a superb job of showing not only that these dialogues (and, along the way, Cicero's Laws) are consistent with scepticism, but also that attributing that stance to the author makes better sense of the dialogues themselves. Wynne limits himself to a detailed and painstaking analysis of Cicero's works and does not venture to address their reception, but I would guess that his fresh account of Cicero's purpose and methods in his dialogues on religion might be of significance for students of Hume as well.

[1] For a very influential discussion of Cicero as a writer of philosophical dialogue, see M. Schofield 'Ciceronian Dialogue', pp. 63-84 in Simon Goldhill (ed.), The End of Dialogue in Antiquity (Cambridge 2008).

[2] Wynne (46-49) explains why the now fragmentary On Fate, which Cicero had meant to be part of the original plan, is not included in his book. On Fate was rethought (and so disconnected from the other two works) when Cicero was drawn back into the upheavals of political life by the assassination of Julius Caesar.

[3] Readers of Platonic dialogues would do well to be as careful on this issue.