Cicero: Political Philosophy

Cicero Political Philosophy

Malcolm Schofield, Cicero: Political Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2021, 285pp., $25.00 (pkb), ISBN 9780199684922.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


Malcolm Schofield’s book (a new addition to the “Founders of Modern Political and Social Thought” series, edited by Mark Philip) is the masterly overview of Cicero’s thought we have needed. It joins another distinguished contribution Schofield has made to this series—his book on Plato’s political philosophy. His Cicero is devoted primarily to an analysis of three works: De Re Publica (which he translates “On the commonwealth”), De Legibus (“On laws”), and De Officiis (“On duties”).

But much else that Cicero wrote—letters, forensic and political speeches, essays on oratory, the gods, moral ends, divination, etc.—bears on his political philosophy and the major role he played in Roman politics. These too receive Schofield’s careful attention. Almost of equal importance are the works of the major historians of Rome—Livy, Sallust, and Tacitus; for Cicero’s political thought must be understood against the background of the history of the Roman republic. Few scholars have read as widely in this material and thought as deeply about it as Schofield.

Another remarkable feature of this book is its attunement to Cicero’s impact both on the history of political thought from the Renaissance to the eighteenth century (the so-called “republican tradition”), and the late twentieth-century revival of that tradition undertaken by historians (notably Quentin Skinner) and philosophers (Philip Pettit). As Schofield formulates the key idea, “if a state is to flourish . . . it must be free from domination by any other political power and from servitude to the arbitrary will of a tyrant” (29). Caesar, as Cicero saw him, was just such a tyrant, and the justification of tyrannicide is one of the leading motifs of his political philosophy. Hobbes, as Schofield notes, includes Cicero on his list of philosophers who subscribe to the “seditious doctrine that Tyrannicide is . . . not only lawful, but even worthy of the greatest praise” (1). Americans are likely to recognize a key republican thesis in the Declaration of Independence, which holds that when a form of government becomes destructive of liberty, it is the “right of the people to alter or abolish it.”

One of the central contributions of Cicero to political thought, on Schofield’s interpretation, is his conception of what a res publica is. He defines it as a res populi (47, citing Rep. I.39). Schofield notes that “this is something close to an etymology”—that is, the phrase res publica developed out of the term res poplica (“the popular res”). As we might put it, the state belongs to the people; it is the people’s property (though Schofield follows Skinner in trying to avoid “state” on the grounds that it connotes an impersonal authority). This definition, Schofield holds, is Cicero’s original formulation: “no other Roman writer explicitly parses the expression in this way” (48). But at the same time “this captures something fundamental in what Romans in general understood by res publica.” As he notes, “The Roman citizen body was sovereign: every magistrate was made a magistrate by election in its assemblies, every law required its assent” (46). In effect, then, Cicero’s definition encapsulates the thought that the way Rome does politics is the way it should be done as a matter of right. As Jefferson formulates the idea in the Declaration of Independence, “governments . . . deriv[e] their just powers from the consent of the governed.”

Schofield calls this “the first clear articulation of the idea [of popular sovereignty] in Greek or Roman thought” (49). He draws this contrast between Aristotle’s political philosophy and Cicero’s:

Aristotle operated with a notion of the city as a collection of citizens whose interests the . . . political system is there to safeguard. By focusing his discussion by contrast on the notion of populus and its rights, Cicero effectively creates an entirely new theory, cast in a legal vocabulary that has no parallel in Greek generally. . . . Its legal inspiration makes it . . . arguably the invention of the very idea of political legitimacy. (52)

But on the same page Schofield says: “Cicero was no democrat. He was far from believing that the power of the populus over its res should be unlimited, or that there should be no constraints on popular liberty” (52). The point is more fully expressed as follows: “if the people themselves behave like tyrants, then it will be imperative for them to be deprived of control of their res, just as the law gives control of the insane to their relatives” (51).

Schofield does not put together these two Ciceronian themes: (a) it is admirable to kill a tyrant, and (b) the populus (not just plebs but patricians as well) may behave like tyrants; but obviously there is a problem here. Is it permissible for those who generally find themselves in a minority of the populus, when their assent is sought in an assembly, to kill those (the majority) who dominate them? Those members of the majority faction are deemed irrational by the minority; therefore “it will be imperative for them to be deprived of control of their res.” This is of course a question Hobbes would press against Cicero and others who approve of tyrannicide.

Schofield admits (217–218) that Cicero has no adequate answer to the question, “when may violence be used against those who exercise sovereign power?” In the De Officiis, he relies on an analogy between rulers who arbitrarily dominate the commonwealth and a diseased limb that threatens the rest of the body. Amputation is called for; similarly we rightly free ourselves from wrongful rule. In fact, for Cicero a tyrant is not really human, but an “inhuman monster . . . masquerading as a human being” (217–218). Schofield admits, “Hobbes would not have been impressed” (219). He should not be—nor should we.

Cicero argues that the best political system is not the rule of one individual, or a few, or many—but a mixture of all three: kingship, aristocracy, and democracy. The collective body of all citizens should have some input into political decision-making (because the republic belongs to them), but only some. But it is fair to ask: if the populus collectively owns the commonwealth, why should not decision-making power ultimately reside solely in that group? It might be replied, on Cicero’s behalf, that although the citizenry as a whole has the right to decide its own affairs, deliberation will go better if the collectivity limits its sphere of influence, and empowers certain individuals and small bodies.

Schofield does eventually attribute this line of argument to Cicero, but he also takes him to believe that it would be unjust (not just ill-advised) for the power of the populus to be total. They are entitled only to some political power because elite groups—the well-born and wealthy—should also have their proper share. As Schofield notes, in the Roman Republic “the power of the vote was heavily weighted in favour of the propertied classes” (44), and Cicero takes Rome as his model of good government. Distinctions in rank (dignitas) must be a factor in the allocation of political power (44). There must be “sufficient authority in the deliberation of the leading men, and sufficient liberty for the people” (45). In Cicero’s words, there should be a “calibration . . . whereby lesser folk thought they were on an equality with the leading men” (“On laws,” 3.24, cited on 46). Schofield comments: “Cicero was aware that his formula for equitable balance could be regarded as a charade no better than a thinly veiled justification for aristocracy” (46). He nonetheless credits Cicero with a deep understanding of why the citizenry should have real (not just the appearance of) power. Even if a king (or a few “leading men”) rules supremely well, he is “effectively their master,” and those ruled are in servitude (72). We have good reason to want not to be dominated (enslaved), even by good rulers.

This is a major theme of the republicanism that thrived in the Renaissance, the Enlightenment, and now lives again. But its characterization of those who have no say in politics as (in effect) slaves is suspect. Do the millions of resident non-citizens who populate the world have terrible lives because they have no political power in the environment they inhabit? Is being a slave in the legal sense (being someone’s property) itself a diminution in well-being? Suppose someone discovers, on the final day of his long and happy life, that he has all along been someone’s property. Should he conclude that his life was not as good as he had supposed? It is what slavery does to people—the effect it has on their thoughts and actions—that makes it horrible.

Cicero, unlike many of his contemporaries, regards a monarchy as a “possible form of res publica”—a legitimate form of government (72). What can be said in its favor is that knowledge and expertise about any matter is not evenly distributed but is reserved to those who have devoted themselves to mastering that subject. Thus Plato, and Schofield’s Cicero, accepts that “. . . any satisfactory theory of government is going to have to take a Platonist conception of ruling seriously” (72). This line of thought is taken up again several pages later, where Schofield says: “the primary need in politics is for consilium, deliberation . . . in the public interest” (76). That requires, in Cicero’s words “sufficient authority in the deliberation . . . of the leading citizens” (77).

Accordingly, in the best commonwealth, there will be an appropriate division of labor. Schofield writes:

the people are to act as the legislative and electoral body, the leading citizens, the deliberative body; with the consuls and other magistrates as executive and judicial officers. . . . Key to the success of a res publica is the recognition by all elements that deliberation must be what steers its course. (77–8)

Cicero thus takes a “Platonist conception of ruling” seriously by giving a small number of “leading citizens” the most important task of politics—deliberating well about justice and the common good. That kind of expertise is what their wealth and status must be used to develop. Even so, the plebs must have legislative and electoral powers, despite their deficits as deliberators, because the res publica belongs to them.

My discussion up to this point has focused on the first three of the seven chapters of Cicero: Political Philosophy. The principal works Schofield examines here are Cicero’s two political treatises—On the commonwealth and On laws. His fourth chapter offers fascinating explorations of Cicero’s cosmopolitanism, his reflections on the justice or injustice of world empire, and the nature of law. Chapter five draws primarily on Cicero’s depiction, in De Officiis, of the virtues to be instilled in the citizens of a commonwealth—a topic of central importance to Renaissance thinkers and best known to us in Machiavelli’s Discourses on Livy. Schofield puts the thesis of this tradition as follows:

Sustaining a republican commonwealth requires the active participation of citizens [who are] fiercely independent, yet restrained in what they think it reasonable to want for themselves; and imbued with a proper regard for each others’ interests; able moreover to trust and cooperate with each other.  (147)

One could not ask for a better description of what is scarce and sorely needed in contemporary political life.

Schofield holds Cicero’s discussion of justice in high regard. It is “one of his most interesting contributions to philosophy and political thought, and one of the most important theoretical treatments of the topic to reach us from classical antiquity” (161). Justice is owed not just to friends and fellow citizens, but also to foreigners and strangers. If we have not been provoked by the injustice of others, we must refrain from harming them, and must give what help we can. This is what Cicero’s cosmopolitanism amounts to. Another component of his conception of justice is a point found nowhere in Plato or Aristotle: one must not only refrain from injustice, but also defend others from unjust treatment. That principle applies not only to individuals, but to their countries as well; it figures in a speech attributed to the Corinthians in Thucydides’ history, and was revived (we learn from Schofield, 165) in an influential anonymous treatise of 1579, Vindiciae, Contra Tyrannos. It is now a controversial principle of international intervention.

Cicero’s conception of justice also includes the principle that “private individuals are never [to be] deprived of their goods by public acts. . . . Commonwealths . . . have been constituted above all in order that people may hold on to their own” (Schofield quoting from On duties, 163). Accordingly, Cicero attacks populares (populist politicians) “for promoting measures of land reform or debt cancellation” (163). This is a feature of his political philosophy that troubles Schofield; Cicero seems to make the interests of the wealthy paramount.

The sixth chapter, “Republic decision-making” begins with a quotation from The Morality of Happiness by Julia Anna, who notes (following Henry Sidgwick) that ancient philosophical ethics uses “attractive” notions like goodness rather than “imperative” notions (obligations, duties, rules). Schofield concedes to Annas that for Cicero and Roman ethics more generally, the “honourable course . . . will eventually become second nature to the virtuous person,” but he adds: “Cicero’s treatise is, after all, titled On duties . . . behaving virtuously [is] a matter of performing those actions that are required of us . . . a matter of doing one’s duty” (185, his emphasis). He adds that the term translated “duty” (officium) is a “Roman moralizing transformation of the Greek kathêkon, ‘what it belongs to us to do.’”

His word “transformation” suggests that the conceptual framework of Roman ethics or Cicero’s works has an element missing from Greek authors. Yet later in this chapter, he writes that the contrasting categories of the honorable (honestum) and the advantageous “were not proprietary to Stoicism . . . but had general currency in philosophical discourse” (199); a footnote, meant to support this claim, refers to Plato’s Gorgias, where we find “a contrast between the beneficial or the pleasurable with the morally admirable (kalon),” (224, n.55). So, although officium is a “moralizing transformation” of a Greek term, for Schofield the category of the honestum in Cicero is just what Plato and Aristotle called morally admirable (kalon). Should we say, then, that there are moral rules, duties, and requirements in the ethics of Plato and Aristotle, contrary to what Annas implies? Schofield writes that her characterization of ancient ethics “perhaps does not quite fit Cicero and Roman ethics” (185). But if it does “not quite fit” Plato and Aristotle either, her contrast fails.

It should not be forgotten that there are imperatival elements in Greek ethics. Socrates says in the Apology that he will obey the god rather than the Athenians, and in the Crito he is commanded (by the personified laws of Athens) to accept his punishment rather than escape from jail, for this is what he owes the city. Aristotle characterizes justice as the virtue of acting lawfully towards others, and surely law does not make mere recommendations—it commands. There are of course major differences between Kantian morality and the philosophical ethics of Greece and Rome, but there are these continuities as well. We can see in the dualistic framework of De Officiis—the honestum and the advantageous—a forerunner of the dualism of the right and the good championed by Kant, Ross, and Rawls. What has changed dramatically is that in the modern dualism the right can limit and override the pursuit of the good, whereas the kalon and the honestum are always the best routes for achieving the good.

My discussion has, I hope, made it clear that Schofield’s book on Cicero is essential reading for anyone with an interest in political or moral philosophy and their history. Unlike Plato and Aristotle, Cicero played a major role in civic life, and that adds credibility to his political reflections. His writings shaped political agents and theorists for many centuries in Italy, Britain, and America. With Schofield’s help, we can better understand why he has been and remains so important.