Cicero's Practical Philosophy

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Walter Nicgorski (ed.), Cicero's Practical Philosophy, University of Notre Dame Press, 2012, 313pp., $42.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268036652.

Reviewed by Nathan Powers, The University at Albany (SUNY)


The title Cicero's Practical Philosophy might imply a book about Cicero's ethical and political theory, but this is not the case. The nine papers assembled here originated in a 2006 conference at Notre Dame whose purpose was (as the volume's editor, Walter Nicgorski, puts it) to explore the "practical orientation" of Cicero's philosophy very broadly understood: that is, the various ways in which Cicero's perspectives as an eminent politician and as a philosopher influenced one another.[1] This conference was a genuinely interdisciplinary effort, bringing together philosophers, classicists, and political scientists, and the result is a stimulating miscellany that is even broader in scope than the above description indicates. Although the quality of the individual papers varies, the overall level of scholarship on display is impressive.

Among the highlights of the collection, Xavier Márquez's wide-ranging essay "Between Urbs and Orbis" argues that Cicero transforms the models of political community that he inherited from the Greeks -- in particular, the Platonic-Aristotelian "urban" model and the Stoic "cosmic" model -- in a way that anticipates (and indirectly influences) many of the essential elements of the modern republican model of a polity (i.e., of a state that both derives its legitimacy from and representatively governs a people). Márquez also persuasively suggests that Cicero is unaware of the degree to which his own view is novel, for he arrives at it by making certain adjustments that simply seem necessary to him in order to accommodate Greek political theory to the distinctive features of Roman society.

If Márquez's Cicero is an accidental innovator, other strong contributions to the volume emphasize Cicero's role as a vital transmitter of information about the Hellenistic schools of philosophy. Malcolm Schofield's "The Fourth Virtue" argues that Cicero's lengthy treatment in De Officiis of the virtue decorum (Cicero's translation of the Greek prepon, which we might translate "appropriateness"), a passage that modern interpreters have tended to consider a confused mess, in fact gives a coherent account that may accurately represent the views of his main source, the Stoic Panaetius. In particular, Schofield suggests that Cicero reflects Panaetius's strategy for reconciling two disparate approaches to discovering what our duties are: the traditional Stoic approach, which fixes the content of my duties in terms of what virtue demands that I do, and Panaetius's own innovative theory of personae, which fixes my duties in terms of what a person in my situation (given the various roles that I play) ought to do. Schofield makes a compelling case that appropriateness or decorum is the concept that Panaetius uses to "harmonize" the two approaches and so to show that the theory of personae is complementary to traditional Stoicism.

Margaret Graver's "Cicero and the Perverse" is a lucid and concise essay that explores how Cicero deals with a vexing difficulty for his ethical theory. Although Cicero does not wholeheartedly endorse Stoic ethics, he does rely extensively on the Stoic claim that virtue is the condition that all human beings naturally develop into; as Cicero says (using Stoic imagery), nature has implanted humans with the "seeds" or "sparks" of virtue. This claim gives him a basis to argue, for example, that justice is not merely a matter of convention, but rather depends upon (and develops out of) a basic sense of fairness that is the same for all human beings across all societies. But the claim lands him with a problem that he has to face alongside the Stoics: if virtue is our natural condition, why do so few humans become virtuous? Cicero's response to this problem is interesting. He identifies two sources of "perversion" of our natural tendency toward virtue. One lies in a confusion, to which young humans are vulnerable, between what is genuinely good (or bad) by nature and what is regularly associated with that good or bad in our experience: pleasure, for example, gets easily confused with the good, and pain with the bad. The second source of perversion is found in persons who have fallen prey to such evaluative confusion and who then transmit it to other people (crucially, to the vulnerable young) by encouraging as good (through praise) and discouraging as bad (through blame) the wrong kinds of behavior. This twofold line of response, though interesting, is hardly original; as Graver demonstrates, Cicero's account of perversion is a close adaptation of the views of the Stoic Chrysippus.

Harald Thorsrud's "Radical and Mitigated Skepticism in Cicero's Academica" tackles a conspicuous puzzle about the character of Cicero's own particular flavor of Academic skepticism. The Academics are unified in their opposition to the Stoic claim that a wise person or sage acts (or forms judgments) only on the basis of experiences of such a reliable character that in accepting them one cannot be mistaken about their truth (these are the Stoics' notorious "kataleptic" impressions). The Academic skeptics think that humans do not have any experiences of that character. But the Academic dissent from the Stoic account takes at least two main forms. "Mitigated" skeptics claim that a wise person will act (and form judgments) in accordance with the criterion of what is most probably true; such sages hold fallible opinions, but they have done their level best to avoid error and to approximate the truth in their beliefs. "Radical" skeptics by contrast accept the Stoic association of wisdom with infallibility; and since they take there to be no "kataleptic" impressions, they conclude that the sage must suspend judgment on all matters and hold no opinions (that is, no beliefs that are based on non-"kataleptic" impressions and, as a result, fallible).

Now, Cicero usually presents himself as a mitigated skeptic, and there is good reason (as Thorsrud rightly emphasizes) to take this to have been his lifelong philosophical allegiance. The puzzle is that in his book most directly devoted to Academic skepticism, the Academica, Cicero appears to waver and to endorse radical skepticism -- or at least, he insists repeatedly that a wise person will hold no opinions. It seems that either Cicero changed his mind on this central issue, or he is very confused, or else (despite appearances) his claims in the Academica are consistent with his usual mitigated skepticism. Thorsrud endorses the third option. His chief suggestion is that when Cicero says that a sage holds no opinions, he means a Stoic sage -- an animal that does not exist. "Real-life" sages can and do hold opinions based on what is probable. If Cicero indeed meant to rely so heavily on this distinction between two sorts of sage in the Academica, however, he would have done well to at least signal that fact; and so I suspect that many readers will, like myself, remain puzzled. Thorsrud's paper is nonetheless the most interesting and valiant attempt I have seen to assign Cicero a consistent skeptical position.

Also noteworthy are J.G.F. Powell's "Cicero's De Re Publica and the Virtues of a Statesman," an interesting but frankly speculative piece that suggests that the (largely lost) final four books of Rep.may have been organized thematically around a discussion of, first, the virtues of a political community (justice and moderation) and, second, those of a statesman (courage and prudence); and J. Jackson Barlow's "Cicero on Property and the State," which argues against the claim that Cicero takes the primary purpose of the state to be the protection of private property. (I would have thought that claim to be fairly obviously false, but apparently it is a view of Cicero that holds some sway among political scientists, so perhaps Barlow's detailed rebuttal will do some good.)

The volume also contains several less satisfying contributions to the literature. David Fott's "The Politico-Philosophical Character of Cicero's Verdict in De Natura Deorum" takes up the longstanding question of why Cicero (the character), after remaining silent throughout most of the theological dispute in N.D., sides tentatively at the end of the dialogue with Stoic doctrine (rather than with the Academic criticisms of both Epicureanism and Stoicism voiced by the character Cotta). Fott offers the novel and intriguing suggestion that he does so not (as has sometimes been thought) because he wants to conceal his own atheism or agnosticism, nor again out of a pious regard for Roman tradition, but rather because he takes the Stoic to have argued his views better than the Academic: Cotta is, in Cicero's view, an inadequate representative of his own school (as Fott attempts to establish through comparison of Cotta with Cicero's own performance as a spokesman for Academic theology in De Divinatione). I doubt, however, whether Fott's charges against Cotta (on Cicero's behalf) can be made to stick. For example, Fott paints Cotta as a "dogmatic naturalist" for claiming that natural phenomena, which the Stoics take to indicate the causal influence of a designing intelligence, could be, rather, the result of nature itself operating blindly. But this is surely a straightforward example of the Academic method of arguing pro and contra: the Stoics have argued pro, and so Cotta brings the contra to bear, in order that we readers may avoid dogmatic rashness.

Carlos Lévy's "Philosophical Life versus Political Life" discusses what the author sees as Cicero's reluctance to choose decisively between a life organized around philosophy -- specifically, the life of a teacher of philosophy -- and a life of political engagement. The way in which Lévy frames this issue is odd. He assumes that Cicero would have found the first option genuinely attractive, due to his admiration for the teachers of his youth (Philo of Larissa, in particular); that he moreover would have felt the strong pull of this attraction not only in his youth but at every stage of his later life; and that, therefore, the fact that Cicero became a lawyer and a magistrate rather than a scholar not only is a fact that stands in need of serious explanation, but also is one that Cicero would have had to reconcile himself to, with some regret, throughout his career. These assumptions are all dubious. It is clear that Cicero was, for a Roman politician of his day, engaged with Greek philosophy to a quite unusual (if not unique) extent, and that he deemed it important on frequent occasions to explain to his friends and to the Roman public that this engagement was consistent with (or even adjunct to) his performance of his public responsibilities.  But it is by no means clear that the young Cicero seriously contemplated a non-political career (let alone that the older Cicero felt the need to justify the rejection of that option). Nonetheless, Lévy's paper draws welcome attention to a number of passages (both in Cicero's published works and in his letters) where his attitude towards the question of the proper role of philosophy in the life of a politician is revealed to be complicated and ambivalent.

Finally, Catherine Tracy's "Cicero's Constantia in Theory and Practice" argues (1) that Cicero was committed to an ideal of constantia (consistency) in his public life; (2) that he did not adopt this ideal for pragmatic political reasons, but rather out of deep personal and philosophical convictions; and (3) that Cicero's ideal of constantia is in open tension with his own Academic skepticism, according to which a person ought to alter his or her beliefs in response to new evidence when it becomes available.

(1) is not difficult to establish, although Tracy usefully brings to bear a wealth of illustrative material that shows the sometimes surprising lengths that Cicero was willing to go to in order to appear not to have changed his mind concerning some previous public act or pronouncement. She also plausibly suggests that this care to preserve a self-consistent public persona stems at least partly from his status as a "new man" in the politics of the Roman Republic: he did not have illustrious ancestors on whom to build an expectation that he would make a reliable magistrate, and so needed to impress his fellow-citizens with the steadfastness of his own character. Tracy fails, however, to make a convincing case for (2) or (3). The evidence she produces for (2) consists of instances in which Cicero professes feelings of anxiety or shame at the prospect of seeming to be inconsistent. But this is hardly evidence that constantia was not for him above all a pragmatic goal. On the one hand, he may well have felt such emotions when he took his reputation for consistency to be threatened or harmed precisely because he understood this reputation to be a cornerstone of his success in politics and so of his standing in Roman society. On the other hand, Cicero's exaggerated expressions of concern for his own self-consistency may well have been pragmatically calculated to prop up his public persona: as if to say, "Just look at how highly I prize my own constantia!"

As for (3), it is strange to claim that to change one's mind in response to new evidence is the special privilege of a skeptic -- indeed, it seems rather to be the obligation of anyone who is rational. And more importantly, there is no reason that an Academic skeptic could not aspire to consistency in his or her life, or indeed could not hope to attain it. If one dogmatically takes there to be a method for attaining truth with certainty, then rational self-consistency will indeed demand that one embrace and follow that method; but if one skeptically takes humans to be incapable of attaining truth conclusively, then rational self-consistency will rather demand suspension of judgment or conditional acceptance of what appears most probable. In either case, the ideal of consistency is not at stake; and so it is hard to see how Cicero's skepticism could be in direct tension with that ideal.

In conclusion, even the less successful pieces in Cicero's Practical Philosophy contain points of substantial interest, and the volume as a whole should appeal to anyone who is interested in Cicero's philosophical writings (and perhaps to some who are interested primarily in Cicero as an orator and statesman). The book's miscellaneous character is not a weakness; if anything, it rather demonstrates that Ciceronian studies are currently in a state of healthy ferment.

[1] The volume includes as an appendix a reprinting of Nicgorski's classic 1978 paper "Cicero and the Rebirth of Political Philosophy," which contains a call for further appreciation of precisely this aspect of Cicero's oeuvre.