Citizen Killings: Liberalism, State Policy and Moral Risk

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Deane-Peter Baker, Citizen Killings: Liberalism, State Policy and Moral Risk, Bloomsbury, 2016, 156pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472575425.

Reviewed by Jason Brennan, Georgetown University


Deane-Peter Baker defines citizen-killings as "state-sanctioned (that is, legally permitted) killings conducted by people who are not agents of the state agent." (2) Consider these two sets of questions:

1. Ethics: What is morally permissible for you to do? May you have an abortion? Own a gun? Travel overseas to wage a private war against the Islamic State? Assist someone who is terminally ill, or simply bored, in committing suicide?
2. Politics: What should the state permit or forbid citizens from doing? Should it allow or forbid abortion and infanticide? Should it allow citizens to own a gun, fight a private war, or assist others in committing suicide?

The first set asks about what citizens may do; the second set asks what the state may do. This book focuses almost entirely on the second set of questions.

Baker reminds us that what the state may permit or forbid is significantly independent of what individuals are obligated, permitted, or forbidden to do. The state is subject to special constraints that individuals are not subject to (and vice versa). Thus answering one set of questions does not suffice to answer the other. To illustrate: Suppose for the sake of argument that Roman Catholicism is the one true and correct religion. If so, it follows that non-Catholics have a moral duty to convert to Catholicism. Still, it does not follow that the state may force them to do so or that it may criminalize other religions.

In the introductory chapter, Baker outlines his general approach. Following John Rawls, Gerald Gaus, David Gauthier, and others, he assumes a hypothetical contractualist view of the state. On this approach, we discover the correct principles of justice and determine the constraints imposed on the state by asking what institutions, norms, and constraints rational individuals in a state of nature would adopt. On Baker's view, the main point of the state is to protect our right to life. He argues that no one would consent to giving state authority to take his life, since the whole point of accepting the social contract was to protect his life. He concludes that the state has a nearly absolute duty to respect the right to life.

Baker glosses over this argument quickly, and the conclusion that the right to life is absolute does a great deal of work for him. But I'm puzzled whether the argument is sound. Suppose the parties to a hypothetical social contract discovered that there is one kind of political regime which makes citizens vastly more prosperous than other regimes. But suppose, thanks to strange laws of physics or sociology, that to make that regime function, the regime must be permitted a one-in-a-billion chance each year of being allowed to kill some innocent citizen at random. Maybe parties would think that's a good deal and take their chances. On Baker's behalf, though, I'm not sure if there's a realistic policy proposal that would be justified by this kind of argument. Still, the more general and familiar problem is that the only way you'll get absolute duties out of a contractarianism is if the parties themselves are absolutists unwilling to make trade-offs between different values. In fact, Baker agrees that the parties to a social contract would accept certain forms of socially beneficial but possibly lethal risk; e.g., they will allow people to drive.

Baker also presupposes that some form of public reason liberalism, as made popular by Rawls, Stanley Benn, Gaus, and others, is correct. One major component of public reason liberalism is the requirement of liberal neutrality. The state may not justify any policy by referring to the rightness of any substantive conception of the good. (10) Baker admits this kind of neutrality is sometimes impossible. In such cases, the state should not take a stance on disputed metaphysical questions, but instead choose the policy that imposes the least moral risk.

A second component of public reason liberalism is the view that freedom is normatively basic. People are presumed free to act as they please. Coercion can be justified only on the basis of reasons which all reasonable people would find compelling. Of course, in the public reason literature, just what counts as "reasonable" is a huge debate. Too often, public reason liberals weaponize the concept in order to exclude any position they dislike. To avoid this, Baker accepts a very expansive conception of the reasonable. He considers a position reasonable (within a given democratic polity) if

1. The position is supported by a significant portion of the population, and
2. The position is the focus of a significant body and serious and respected argument put forward by people generally recognized as intellectually credible (122).

For example, in the United States, a large percentage of people regard abortion as murder. Serious, credible intellectuals offer widely accepted arguments for the pro-life position. Baker claims the state is required, on pain of neutrality, to view the pro-life position as reasonable. It cannot just dismiss the pro-life view on the grounds that it is religiously motivated, because the state may not take a stance on whether widely held religious beliefs are reasonable or rational. As we'll soon see, this leads to some surprising conclusions.

Chapter one concerns whether the state must allow citizens to own firearms. Baker argues that the right to own a gun depends not on empirical or statistical questions (i.e., on whether gun control in general makes us safer or not) but instead on "whether or not firearms are a reasonable and effective means for exercising the right to self-defense." (21) He admits most of us will never need a gun. Nevertheless, he thinks, just because most people will never need a gun for self-defense, that does not mean we have the right to deprive the rare individuals who do need them of the right to defend themselves.

The right to a firearm, if it exists, is not a fundamental right, but derives from the fundamental right to self-defense, which is itself derived from right to life. Any restriction on self-defense or the right to life faces strict scrutiny, Baker claims, because if a person is wrongly killed, he cannot recover damages or be compensated. In the social contract, the individual cedes the right of self-defense to the state, but only in cases where the state can and will effectively protect and defend him. Individuals retain a right of self-defense and a derivative right to access to reasonable means to protect themselves.

Chapter two investigates whether the state may stop its citizens from fighting for just causes in conflicts where the state is not itself a party. For example, may the Australian government forbid an Australian citizen from becoming private mercenary who fights the Islamic State? Again, Baker claims that the state must be neutral. It has a right to protect its citizens from violent attacks, and so may prevent its citizens from joining terrorist organizations that target its citizens. But, he argues, that is all it may do. The Australian government may not forbid Australians from becoming mercenaries just because most Australians find mercenary work distasteful. One might object that private mercenaries hurt their home country's foreign relations. But, Baker contends, the state does not have a right to avoid being embarrassed by or having its reputation harmed by its citizens. (Consider: If the state did have such a right, it would thereby have the illiberal right to censor citizens who say embarrassing things that hurt the country's reputation.) Baker concludes the state may not forbid its citizens from fighting on behalf of justice in just conflicts, even if the state itself is not involved.

Chapter three concerns euthanasia and assisted suicide. Baker claims that liberal neutrality forbids the state from deciding on any criterion of what makes a life worth living, nor may it accept religious arguments which forbid suicide. (This seems to be inconsistent with what Baker says in chapter four, where he says the state must regard religious citizens' pro-life views as reasonable.) The state must allow citizens to die if they genuinely consent to die (even for frivolous reasons), and it must allow doctors or others to assist them in committing suicide. Baker also argues that this presents the state with a serious problem: When should we pull the plug on patients and consider them dead? Baker claims there is reasonable disagreement as to when a person is dead, but claims the state make take a compromise position: it must "set the legal bar for the end of life decision at the cessation of either brain function or unassisted cardiopulmonary function, whichever of the two lasts longest." (57)

Chapters four and five -- bound to be the most controversial -- concern abortion. Baker notes that the question of just when a human being acquires a right to life is widely disputed. He seems to allow that perhaps Peter Singer and Jeff McMahan could be correct: perhaps the correct moral view is that children do not acquire that right until late into infancy. However, Baker says, once again the state is required to be neutral on this difficult moral question. A great number of reasonable citizens in many countries (such as the USA) regard abortion as murder. It cannot just dismiss their view. (Again, if not, then why may it dismiss religious objections to suicide?)

However, the state must make a decision; it must either allow abortion or criminalize it. Baker argues that state should take the position which involves the least moral risk. Suppose the state allows abortion, but in fact the pro-life view is correct; in that case, the state has wrongly sanctioned mass baby murder. Suppose the state forbids abortion, but in fact the pro-choice view is correct; in that case, the state has wrongly forced women to bear children. The first mistake is far worse than the second.

Baker says that the state should worry, since there are good arguments for both sides, that it will pick the wrong policy. Since it would be worse to wrongly murder babies than to wrongly force women to bear children, he concludes the state should outlaw abortion. However, he claims, the state cannot force women to raise the children after they are born (the state will have to put the infants up for adoption or care for them as its wards), and the state may have to provide for women during pregnancy.

Baker has a second argument in support of this surprising conclusion. He notes that many readers believe "humanitarian conscription" can be justified. (I don't, but many people do.) That is, they agree that in emergencies, to prevent mass death or other humanitarian tragedies, the state may conscript civilians to perform aid work, dig trenches to stop the floor, or take up arms against the fascist invaders. Baker claims that forcing women to bear unwanted children is form of humanitarian conscription, which most of his readers think is permissible in other, analogous contexts.

In chapter five, Baker argues that citizens may use violence to stop abortion clinics. On its face, this does not seem strange position for a pro-life person to take. Indeed, I am always surprised more pro-lifers do not come out and agree. If abortion is baby murder, then of course we can kill abortion doctors to stop them from engaging in mass murder. (This follows from the right of defense of others.)

However, I am not sure why Baker defends this position in the book or how it follows from his argument in chapter four. After all, the argument in chapter four did not establish that abortion was in fact morally wrong. Rather, he argued that the liberal state -- in order to maintain liberal neutrality in the face of reasonable disagreement about the morality of abortion -- is required to take the risk-averse position of outlawing abortion. But individual citizens in a liberal state are not bound by the principle of liberal neutrality. (After all, while a state is forbidden from taking a stance on the truth of Islam, individuals are free to convert.) Thus, it's not clear how the argument from chapter four bears on what citizens may or may not do.

I am skeptical that any form of public reason liberalism or hypothetical contractarianism can be made to work. Nevertheless, thanks to Rawls's later work, public reason liberalism seems to be the dominant background theory in political philosophy. Baker intends to take public reason liberalism seriously and draw out its implications. His conclusions do not fit neatly with any ideology -- egalitarian liberal, libertarian, American conservative, or otherwise. I take that as presumptive evidence that he really is drawing out the implications of the theory. It does not seem like he's just rationalizing his pre-existing beliefs. (In contrast, other public reason liberals, such as Rawls, seem always to discover that public reason liberalism fortuitously happens to privilege the very ideology they had before they discovered the theory.) Most public reason liberals will reject Baker's conclusions, and some may find his conclusions horrifying, but that may simply be because they refuse to follow their premises where they lead. Baker's work presents a real challenge for them. It's an important challenge for the rest of us, too, who might be inclined to accept principles of liberal neutrality on other grounds. In the end, political decisions are momentous, and there is a huge risk we will pick the wrong policy and violate people's rights in horrific ways. Perhaps there is some important role for a principle requiring us to take the least moral risk.