Civil Society in Liberal Democracy

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Mark Jensen, Civil Society in Liberal Democracy, Routledge, 2011, 189pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415886321

Reviewed by Michael Schefczyk, Leuphana University, Lüneburg (Germany)


It is a truth universally acknowledged among political philosophers and theorists that democracy requires a relatively high degree of civic virtue. As Anthony Downs pointed out, pure rational egoists would not even take the trouble to vote under normal circumstances. No democratic election could be accomplished without a critical number of citizens who are prepared to act against their narrow self-interest and who are willing to support democratic institutions. This confronts us with the questions of where and how citizens acquire their willingness and ability to support the democratic order, the common answer being that the "supportive moral character required for the stability of democratic institutions" is formed in civil society.

Mark Jensen's concise book, Civil Society in Liberal Democracy, calls this answer the Civil Society Requirement. Jensen's account of this Requirement is optimistic in the sense that he considers democratic virtue not to be exhausted by the readiness to vote or to comply with democratically legitimated laws and policies. True democrats are willing and able to participate in what Jensen calls the Grand Conversation. By this term he refers to his ideal model of civil society. An ideal civil society has a double role in Jensen's view. It is the social space in which citizens (i) pursue their comprehensive conceptions of the good life within groups (like associations, churches and so forth) and in which they (ii) foster a liberal democratic culture. The Grand Conversation consists in an open-ended intellectual exchange between these groups as to what the good life really is:

the ideal envisioned here requires an educated and engaged citizenry, a people who are critically reflective about their upbringing, experiences and traditions, who aim to live an examined life, display the humility appropriate to their epistemic circumstances, and aren't afraid to make changes to their visions and plans in light of the deliverances of their investigations or the investigations of their group. (113)

It is an open question whether such a conversation will finally result in a joint comprehensive view; for Jensen's part, he expects that disagreements about conceptions of the good "will never be completely resolved" (114). But the Grand Conversation will deepen the understanding of the good and probably further a higher degree of convergence between different comprehensive doctrines. Moreover, the participation of different societal groups in a joint inquisitive endeavor will foster a sense of belonging-together and solidarity in the citizenry. A civil society that sustains a Grand Conversation will thus dovetail with the political culture and institutions of a deliberative democracy. These are, roughly, the main points of this interesting book. Let me now turn to a few questions which I find worthy of discussion.

The first point concerns Jensen's claim that deliberative democracy is an attractive political arrangement for pluralist conditions with regard to values and reason. In contrast to what Jensen claims, I think that deliberative democracy loses most of its attractiveness under conditions of pluralism of reason. If there were no joint understanding as to what counts as a reason to accept a claim, deliberative practices would lack a basis. Besides, I doubt that pluralism of reason is compatible with Jensen's supposition "that the pluralisms found in our ideal nation-state are reasonable" (104). In my understanding, reasonable pluralism results from what Rawls famously called the 'burdens of judgment', and not from a plurality of reason.

The second point bears on the role of individuals in Jensen's ideal of civil society. As mentioned before, Jensen conceives civil society to consist of people "living out their vision of the good life in groups" (109). He emphasizes that the grand conversation takes place between groups, not individuals. Participation in the grand conversation, he writes, is an "aspect of a group's external projects" (113). My misgivings about this approach are twofold. First, if one sticks to the conventional distinction between questions of the good and questions of the right, it seems overly narrow to understand civil society in Jensen's manner. To give an example, the struggle of civil society organizations like Amnesty International against torture is not, in any straightforward sense, motivated by a conception of the good life. It is driven by the conviction that it is morally wrong to violate human rights. Admittedly, the distinction between the good and the right may be artificial in some cases. Perhaps the British Quakers who campaigned against the slave trade assumed that morally corrupt actions necessarily make the agent's life worse. But many, maybe most, modern philosophers would insist that we have to distinguish between the good and the right.

Second, in contrast to Jensen's view that the "participants in the grand conversation should be understood to be in the first instance groups, not individuals" (113), it seems to me that individuals play an increasingly important role in public discourse. Jensen is well aware of the fact that citizens' "lives and identities in the modern state are complex" (111) and that they belong to various groups. But I think that he fails to draw the obvious conclusion. What sociologists like Zygmunt Baumann, Ulrich Beck and Anthony Giddens call 'individualization' leads to a situation in which ordinary people normally cannot and do not claim to speak in the name of a particular group. It is certainly right that individuals frequently express their views as group members. But one has to distinguish between statements of individuals as group members and statements (in the name) of a group. Only representatives have the authority to speak for the group. Looked at that way, Jensen's approach is tantamount to the view that civil society consists ideally of group representatives who engage in a grand conversation about the good life. Again, this seems to be overly narrow.

My third point is partly but not entirely exegetical. Jensen opens with a critical discussion of a famous passage in Kant's essay "Toward Perpetual Peace", in which Kant claims that the difficulty of organizing a state must be soluble even for a "race of devils". The passage lends itself to rebuttal if one interprets it, as Jensen does, to the effect that a stable liberal regime can be upheld by "rational citizens who know their interests and pursue these efficiently." (5) But this is not what Kant had in mind, as becomes clear when one takes into account that he depicts the "race of devils" as a "multitude of thinking beings who all want universal laws for their preservation, but each of whom are secretly inclined to make an exception of himself." Obviously, Kant's devils are not particularly devilish; they are only human. The bald-headed man at the back of the omnibus, as Walter Bagehot referred to common citizens, is in favor of taxation, but when it comes time to fill in the tax declaration he is 'secretly inclined' to evade them. In my understanding, Kant's passage underlines that the design of political institutions must reckon with the possibility, even likeliness, of non-compliance. Kant's remark that the state must be able to cope with a citizenry of devils was, I think, simply a plea for a realistic view of human nature in political philosophy. Kant did not reject what Jensen calls the Civil Society Requirement.

I mention this otherwise not terribly important exegetical point because it has to do with a perhaps more relevant complaint about Jensen's sometimes confusing alternation between ideal and non-ideal theory. At one point, Jensen reminds the reader that his central "goal in developing an ideal model of civil society is to provide an explanation for the cultivation and maintenance of a liberal democratic political culture." (115) It is difficult to see how a model which describes a normative ideal can possibly do explanatory work with regard to real democracies. Perhaps Jensen means that his ideal model of civil society is a hypothetical explanation for the possibility of an ideal deliberative democracy. However, by opening the book with a criticism of Kant, Jensen gives the impression that the text will deal with conditions for the stability of real democratic institutions. The Civil Society Requirement, for instance, is an empirical claim. Somehow the empirical interest in the real stability conditions of real liberal democracies fell overboard during the journey or got confusingly intertwined with ideal theory.

The last point I shall touch on here concerns Jensen's conviction that an ideal deliberative democracy does not presuppose a fully democratic and egalitarian civil society. For the purpose of illustration, let me give an example of the opposite view: John Stuart Mill argued that the subjection of women is not only a grave injustice but also a massive obstacle to the moral and political progress of mankind. The attempt to make the equal right of the weak the principle of society, Mill argued, "will always be an uphill struggle" as long as the family is the "citadel of inequality". Jean Cohen and Andrew Arato generalized a similar view. According to them, all associations of civil society ought to comply with democratic and egalitarian principles. This 'ethics of democratization' is incompatible with many traditional arrangements; it involves, as Cohen and Arato write, "a communicative opening-up of the sacred core of traditions".

With an interesting twist of thought, Jensen argues that the ethics of democratization will eliminate institutions and arrangements which are "most directly responsible for sustaining a liberal democratic political culture" (57). He substantiates this thesis with the examples of a church, the local chapters of a labor union and an environmentalist movement. All three of them, he argues, rely to a different degree on hierarchy, authority, education, and apprenticeship -- "systems that contradict the principles of discourse ethics" (63). Apprenticeship means that novices have to learn from higher-ranking members how the goals of the association should be pursued. Jensen admits that labor unions and environmentalist groups are usually much closer to the democratic ideal than churches. Nonetheless, he insists that they are also "marked by undemocratic, non-egalitarian values" (61); they are "merit-based and directive, not representative." (63)

One might quibble over the question whether proponents of discourse ethics really deny the legitimacy of knowledge- and experience-based authority and hierarchy in environmentalist groups and labor unions. More important, perhaps, is the question whether Jensen's argument leads to a plausible result. Empirical evidence seems to suggest that fundamentalist associations tend to make no positive contribution to the maintenance of democratic culture, to say the least. If I understand Jensen correctly, he claims that ideals of democratization that would delegitimize fundamentalist or traditionalist arrangements would also delegitimize trade unions, environmentalist groups and so forth. Political efforts to make associations in civil society more democratic and more egalitarian would thus threaten liberal democracy altogether. But is it really impossible to formulate an ethics of democratization that allows us to distinguish in a significant manner between fundamentalist and non-fundamentalist associations and to deepen democratic culture thereby? I have stated my doubts.