Civilian Immunity in War

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Igor Primoratz (ed.), Civilian Immunity in War, Oxford University Press, 2007, 263pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199290741.

Reviewed by Steven P. Lee, Hobart and William Smith Colleges


One of the chief mechanisms for limiting the damage of war is the jus in bello principle of civilian immunity from military attack, which is an aspect of the principle of discrimination or distinction. It is perhaps the key factor that distinguishes war from barbarism. However, respect for this principle has frequently been conspicuous by its absence over the past century, to the point where it often has seemed more aspirational than operational. But the very tenuousness of the hold this principle has on military behavior makes it all the more urgent that we seek a clearer understanding of it. This excellent collection of essays contributes greatly to such an understanding. The first six essays explore the various theoretical issues surrounding the principle, while the final five essays address more specific applications of the principle. In this review, I will focus primarily on the theoretical issues.

The principle of civilian immunity (PCI) is a bedrock of our moral understanding of war. But it raises many questions. (1) What is the basis of the principle -- is it a mere convention, a consequentialist rule-of-thumb, or a fundamental moral rule? (2) Does the principle provide immunity for all civilians, or only for some? (3) Does the principle proscribe all killings of protected civilians or only those killings that are intentional; and, if the latter, how do we understand the notion of "collateral damage" and the doctrine of double effect, which is supposed to set moral restrictions on the unintended civilian deaths? (4) Is the principle an absolute one, or is it subject to override in the face of a "supreme emergency"? (5) What impact has the changing nature of warfare, in both its technological aspects and social aspects, had on the principle?

Consider what the authors have to say about the first question, the moral basis of the PCI. One option is to claim that the principle has, in fact, no basis. Igor Primoratz, in his essay, considers and dismisses two arguments to this effect. One is George Orwell's argument from distributive justice that the harm from war should be spread among all groups in society, not borne exclusively by the young and healthy. But, Primoratz argues, this treats war as a kind of natural disaster rather than a matter of human choice. Another, more familiar argument is that, in an age of total war, whole societies are mobilized for the war effort, so that all citizens bear responsibility. But, while it may be true that some civilians bear moral responsibility for a war, the argument ignores the fact that many civilians bear no responsibility and that most civilians who are implicated in the war effort are not deserving of death.

This second argument against the PCI seems to assume that the basis of immunity from attack would have to be lack of moral responsibility for the war. This idea, referred to as the moral guilt view, is that moral responsibility for a war makes a person liable to attack in that war. The question then becomes whether civilians bear such responsibility. But there is an alternative basis of liability, one adopted by many contemporary just war theorists, such as Michael Walzer and Elizabeth Anscombe. It is referred to as the defense view: a person's liability to attack in war is based on the threat, if any, that the person directly imposes on others, not on that person's moral responsibility for the war. This makes the justification of military attack analogous to that of individual self-defense. On the defense view, combatants impose such a direct threat, so they are liable to attack, while civilians in general do not. This explains civilian immunity.

The essay by Colm McKeogh lays out nicely the historical sources of the two approaches. He argues that Augustine based his just war thinking on the moral guilt view, and this view held sway until it was abandoned by Grotius in favor of what became the defense view. Both the moral guilt view and the defense view are opposed by those who see PCI as a consequentialist rule of thumb or a mere convention. Primoratz criticizes this position on the grounds that such a conception of PCI is too weak and misunderstands the moral basis of the principle. One important issue related to the choice between the moral guilt view and the defense view is the relation in just war theory between jus ad bellum and jus in bello (of which PCI is a part). Many theorists, including Walzer, argue that the two levels of moral analysis are independent, in the sense that judgments at one have no implications for judgments at the other. While the independence thesis can fit with the defense view, it is at odds with the moral guilt view. This is explored in the essay by Seumas Miller, among others. Miller argues that combatants fighting a just war have no moral responsibility for the harm they do to opposing combatants, because they are defending against aggression, while combatants fighting an unjust war, being the aggressors, bear moral responsibility for the harm they do, whether to combatants or to civilians. Combatants fighting a just war are immune from attack.

The next question is whether all civilians are protected by the PCI, or only some. (This is setting aside cases where civilians take up arms, a topic explored in David Kretzmer's essay.) Is there a category of "responsible bystander" (as Primoratz suggests)? Because this is a question of liability, different views of liability may yield different answers. Supporters of the defense view see all civilians, in general, as having immunity from attack, while supporters of the moral guilt view see some civilians, namely, those who share moral guilt for the harm caused by an unjust war, as liable to attack. The position that all civilians are immune is presented by Kretzmer in his explication of the international law perspective. The position that some civilians are not immune, due to their moral responsibility for rights violations, is developed by Miller.

Turning to the third question, an important issue in the applicability of the PCI is the moral relevance of the intentions of combatants who kill civilians in war. As Tony Coady reminds us in his essay, civilians may be killed in war intentionally, incidentally, or accidently. The incidental and accidental deaths are often referred to as "collateral damage," but this euphemism masks an important moral distinction. Incidental deaths are those that were foreseen or should have been foreseen by the attacker, so are a matter of greater moral concern than accidental deaths, which are unforeseen. But the doctrine of double effect (DDE) argues that there is also an important moral distinction between intentional and incidental deaths. While the former are prohibited, the latter are permitted under the weaker requirement of proportionality. The harm of the incidental deaths must not be disproportionate to the benefit of the military action. So, the PCI applies to intentional civilian deaths but not to incidental ones. Coady endorses the moral distinction embodied in the DDE, but argues that there is an important pre-condition for the DDE, namely, that it be applied to a proposed military action only when there is no alternative way of achieving the military objective which imposes less of a risk to civilians. In opposition to Coady's qualified acceptance of the DDE, McKoegh rejects the doctrine, holding that no foreseen civilian death is acceptable.

Coady also endorses Walzer's qualification of the DDE, that it be understood as requiring a double intention. Combatants must not only not intend to kill civilians, but they also must intend to minimize the risk to civilians, even when that involves increased risks for the combatants. Similar to this idea of double intention, and also to Coady's pre-condition, is a feature of international humanitarian law discussed by Kretzmer, namely, that there are three principles involved in respect for civilian immunity, the principles of distinction (or discrimination) and proportionality (both recognized by the traditional DDE), and the principle of precaution. The principle of precaution requires that combatants take action to avoid or minimize incidental harm to civilians.

Is immunity for those civilians counted as nonliable an absolute moral prohibition? Can it be overridden or superseded by other moral concerns? This is the issue that Walzer wrestles with in his doctrine of supreme emergency. Some of our authors agree with Walzer that this immunity is not absolute. Uwe Steinhoff argues for the relevance of "justifying emergency theory." Wartime liability to or immunity from attack is not based on a single moral approach, as we have been assuming, but instead is determined by a weighing of four different approaches, three of which we have already discussed -- the moral guilt view, the defense view, and the view that the PCI is a conventional rule. His fourth approach is the justifying emergency theory, which can override the other three, denying civilian immunity in extreme cases. Primoratz also endorses an emergency override of the PCI, claiming that the principle is "almost absolute," though he criticizes Walzer's doctrine of supreme emergency as being too permissive.

The final question brings us to a brief discussion of the last five essays. How has the PCI fared in the light of changes in the nature of warfare? Some of the relevant changes are technologically based, such as aerial bombardment in the middle of the last century and precision guided munitions in our own time. The essay by Stephen Garrett is a detailed and careful discussion of how support for the PCI was eroded in the course of World War II in Europe, where the Allies came to practice "area bombing," causing an estimated 500,000 German civilian deaths. He asks why the forces believing themselves to be fighting for the right could descend to such slaughter. The essay by Hugo White discusses the normative impact of precision guided munitions. These technologies have revolutionized the role of the PCI in aerial bombardment (though not in ground combat), making it feasible to avoid most civilian casualties, and the air forces of the United States now actively support a robust PCI. At the same time, as White notes, such technological capacities make wars cheaper and less risky, making wars more frequent and easier to choose, and he suggests that the United States and its allies would not have undertaken either of the two Gulf Wars, the Kosovo War, or the Afghanistan War in the absence of such technology (and not for fear of violating the PCI).

The other major change in the nature of warfare in our time has been the advent of "new wars," mainly wars involving sub-state agents. Paul Gilbert, in his essay, discusses how the "identity politics" of the new wars has changed the goals for which they are fought and the way they are fought. The old wars pursued the interests of states, while the new wars pursue the interests of ethnic groups, which involve human-rights outrages such as genocide and ethnic cleansing, requiring violation of the PCI. Gilbert suggests that this is a return to something like the punitive model of Augustine -- punishment is collectivized and civilians are liable for attack due to the alleged sins of their ancestors or their culture. One moral dimension of the new wars, implicit in their basis in collective punishment, is the use of rape as a weapon of war. This is explored in the essay by Veronique Zanetti. She considers the way in which international humanitarian law has and should respond to this phenomenon, and she argues that women are subject to this form of abuse not due to their gender as such, but due to their socio-economic position in society.

Finally, Janna Thompson's essay explores the extent to which civilian property should be immune from attack. She argues that part of the importance of respecting civilian property is related to the saving of civilian lives, given the role property plays in someone's leading a meaningful life.

This anthology is an excellent discussion of most of the important issues connected with the principle of civilian immunity. It is extensive in its coverage and, in many of the essays, breaks new ground.