Classical and Romantic German Aesthetics

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Bernstein, J. M. (ed.), Classical and Romantic German Aesthetics, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 356pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN: 0521001110.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge , Swarthmore College


This volume collects English translations of various texts loosely on aesthetic theory by seven classical (Enlightenment) and Romantic German authors: Hamann, Lessing, Moritz, Schiller, Hölderlin, Novalis, and Friedrich Schlegel. It replaces a number of earlier collections from Cambridge that are now, sadly, all out of print: The Origins of Modern Critical Thought: German Aesthetic and Literary Criticism from Lessing to Hegel, ed. David Simpson (1988); German Aesthetic and Literary Criticism: Kant, Fichte, Schelling, Schopenhauer, Hegel, ed. David Simpson (1984); German Aesthetic and Literary Criticism: The Romantic Ironists and Goethe, ed. Kathleen Wheeler (1984), and German Aesthetic and Literary Criticism: Winckelmann, Lessing, Hamann, Herder, Schiller and Goethe, ed. H. B. Nisbet (1986), as well as German Romantic Criticism: Novalis, Schlegel Schleiermacher and others, ed. A. Leslie Willson (Continuum, 1982). In the absence of these other volumes, the texts of these authors are not teachable in English, and they are not likely to be widely known to philosophers. Hence Bernstein’s collection is especially timely and useful.

Its timeliness and usefulness are not, however, simply a matter of historical coverage. As Bernstein makes clear in a substantial, 26-page introduction, the theoretical writings on art and culture of Schiller, Schlegel, and, especially Hölderlin have recently attracted a great deal of philosophical interest of the highest order, largely developing out of the work of Dieter Henrich on Hölderlin’s early philosophical writings and on the Tübingen and early Jena circles of relationship, conversation, and influence. Bernstein’s introduction both usefully surveys this recent work and contributes to its development, well beyond simply introducing the texts that follow. In this respect, this volume is prepared more for philosophers and more as a contribution to systematic thinking about art, philosophy, the subject, and culture than were its predecessors, which appear rather as simpler historical compendia. Though the Simpson Origins collection would be more useful (were it not out of print) as a sourcebook in containing 14 authors (in 449 pages) the philosophical thematization that Bernstein accomplishes is a central strength of this volume.

Bernstein carries out this thematization under five headings: 1) the crisis of reason in modernity in relation to the disenchantment of nature; 2) critical attention to the specificities of artistic achievement that are possible in different media of art; 3) the effort after Kant to grasp how freedom might be embodied and achieved within sensible nature, through artistic production and cultivation; 4) a counterposed tragic conception of such embodiment and achievement as possible only in part, in transitory moments of balance; and 5) the effacement of sensible nature and the abandonment of the effort at tragic balance, in favor of self-authorizing subject-activity in ironic, witty, self-critical art.

The first heading announces the main theme of the entire collection. With the advent of modernity and the disenchantment of nature, the human subject is threatened with “losing its substantiality, its worldliness” (p. x). That is, without any language or reasons that are understood to be embodied in a comprehensive system of nature and culture, but coming instead to face only ’lifeless’ materiality, the subject is faced with the possibility, it seems, of making only criterionless, arbitrary choices. No good reason other than want or whim presents itself in favor of any way of life, and this makes it difficult to believe in the worth of who and what one chooses to be, at least for those who feel a need for such belief. The solution that is proposed, in different ways, by each of the authors here collected is a turn to “aesthetic reason” or “reason aestheticized” (p. ix). The making of a work of art, which is taken to involve the discovery of what the organization of the work itself demands of the artist, is taken to be either a model for or the very substance of the discovery of commanding ends within human, cultural life. As the author, presumably Hölderlin, of the “Oldest Programme for a System of German Idealism” puts it, “The philosopher must possess just as much aesthetic power as the poet… . The philosophy of the spirit is an aesthetic philosophy” (p. 186; cited p. ix).

Each of the remaining headings is then identified principally with a particular way of carrying out the project of an aesthetic philosophy or of the aestheticization of moral-cultural reason as that project is envisioned by a particular writer. In distinguishing sharply between the subject-matters and manners of presentation that are proper, respectively, to poetry and to painting, Lessing in “Laocoön” discovers norms that are internal to the medium-specific work of the creative artist. As Bernstein puts it, for Lessing “medium is syntax; … it constrains the semantic contents that are possible” (p. xii). Poetry, for Lessing, has greater range or more subject matters open to it than does painting, just as modern life affords significantly more and more plastic ways of being than did Ancient Greek life. Compared with painting, “poetry is the more comprehensive art, … [and] beauties are at her command which painting can never attain” (p. 60). Yet in order to achieve its proper end, poetry should achieve in its own way something like the sensuous-imaginative presence to the viewer of a striking painting. It must be as absorbing for its reader as the beautiful painting is for its beholder, or, as Lessing puts it, “the poet should always paint” (p. 87). Lessing’s articulation of this medium-specific aim for poetry and his critical prescriptions for achieving it effectively introduce a model for the artistic construction of a specific life in modernity, with its own commanding immanent ends, though Lessing himself does not develop this point.

Instead, the task of describing how a human life can and should involve determination or shaping “from within” (p. xxii) and yet also within the realm of sensuous appearance or empirical life (not in an isolated noumenal world apart) was taken up by Friedrich Schiller in his aesthetic theorizing, in response to Kant’s moral philosophy and Critique of Judgment. As Schiller puts it in the “Kallias Letters” (1793), included here rather than the more widely known Letters Concerning the Aesthetic Education of Man, “the analogy of an appearance with the form of pure will or freedom is beauty… . Beauty is nothing less than freedom in appearance” (p. 152). To say this is to say nothing less than that free human life within nature and culture is possible if and only if it achieves that kind of internal organization, determination from within, or harmony of parts that is characteristic of both natural and artistic beauty. In a beautiful natural object, we find, as it were, “the person of the thing” (p. 163); we have a sense of “the free consent of the thing to its technique” (p. 165) and of “a rule which is at once given and obeyed by the thing” (p. 167), and this is a model for the free consent of an individual to the worth of a social repertoire or way of life.

Like Schiller, Hölderlin too undertakes to envision how (Kantian) freedom might be achieved within nature and culture, in and through the free artistic production of beautiful works, relationships, and manners of life. Henrich has usefully described what he calls “Hölderlin’s ’speculative pro and con’ [as] an attempt at a ’unification philosophy.’“1 Here the emphasis should fall on Hölderlin’s continuing effort to think aesthetically about how to blend independent selfhood and free creativity with loving absorption in beautiful nature and human relationships. As Hölderlin argues in the fragment “Judgment and Being” (1795), here reprinted as “Being Judgment Possibility,” we are, as finite, discursive, self-conscious subjects cast out of oneness with the whole of being to which we nevertheless long to return, yet without sacrificing our independence. As a result, the best that we can do is to achieve a continuous harmonious modulation between moods of self-assertion and attachment, without end. Our lives are then essentially tragic, and, as Bernstein puts it, “tragedy is the narrative that makes manifest our separation from an origin to which we remain bound” (p. xxv).

Friedrich Schlegel in contrast seeks to enact a kind of imperfect yet always energetic freedom in continuous, ironic, witty, self-revising activity. In Athenaeum Fragment #116—perhaps the most famous and most comprehensively summary of his fragments—Schlegel claims that “the romantic kind of poetry … alone is infinite, just as it alone is free; and it recognizes as its first commandment that the will of the poet can tolerate no law above itself” (pp. 249-50). Schlegel’s emphasis on willful, iconoclastic, ironic and always self-revising self-activity as the vehicle of selfhood---a kind of commitment to eternal restlessness---is the opposite of Hölderlin’s longing for unity with Being. As Bernstein aptly remarks, “one might consider the programs of Hölderlin and Jena romanticism [Schlegel and Novalis] as forming opposing sides of the fragile Schillerian synthesis” (p. xxiii), according to which free selfhood could wholly appear in beautiful nature and art, at least in principle.

The central theoretical texts of Schiller, Hölderlin, and Schlegel on aesthetic reason and the production of art as media of free selfhood in the world are of considerably more than antiquarian interest, at least for anyone who retains a sense of the burdens and possibilities of self-consciousness and conscience. As Bernstein summarizes the argument of the collection, “if we watch carefully, the path that runs from Lessing to [Hölderlin to] Jena romanticism looks uncannily like the path that runs from artistic modernism to the postmodern art scene of the present” (p. viii). This summary remark means to suggest, I take it, that there remain as yet not fully canvassed possibilities of aesthetic reason and of self-cultivation that are worked out by Hölderlin, who falls in the middle of the spectrum, between Schillerian, modernist self-formation in and through the wholly self-enclosed modernist work of art and Schlegelian, post-modernist, emptily iconoclastic drift. That this collection presents this possibility in its historical context, in comparison and contrast with major competitors and eloquently and aptly introduced, makes it well worth current philosophical attention on the part of anyone concerned with the plights and possibilities of the human subject in culture.

It is, therefore, somewhat puzzling that the core materials of the collection---Lessing’s “Laocoön,” Schiller’s Kallias Letters, Hölderlin’s System Program and “Judgment and Being” fragments, and Schlegel’s “Critical Fragments,” “Athenaeum Fragments,” “Ideas,” and “On Incomprehensibility” are surrounded here by distinctly minor pieces that do not really help to advance the important core themes of the collection. (It is noteworthy that the introductory essay focuses only on Lessing, Schiller, Hölderlin, and Schlegel.)

J. G. Hamann’s “Aesthetica in nuce” (1762), which opens the collection, usefully sounds the themes of the loss of the divine-ethical word in nature and of the importance of nonetheless awakening from present slumbers through responsiveness to the poetic word. But it does so in a text that it so hermetic as to be all but unreadable. (Its subtitle is “A Rhapsody in Cabbalistic Prose.”) Karl Philipp Moritz’s “On the Artistic Imitation of the Beautiful” (1788) participates in the shift from a Neo-classical to a Romantic sense of the self in urging that appropriate imitation of another person involves “striving after and competing” as opposed to “aping” (p. 132). But it urges this thought within the framework of a survey of the characterological concepts of the useful, the good, the noble, and the beautiful that is—as characterology—more in keeping with French and Neo-classical models than with the more German, Romantic, and arts-oriented discourse of Bildung. In addition to the major theoretical fragments already mentioned, we have from Hölderlin a “Letter to Hegel, 26 January 1796,” “The Significance of Tragedy” (1802), and “Remarks on Oedipus” (1803). It is puzzling why these are preferred to Hölderlin’s major poetological essays, especially “On the Operations of the Poetic Spirit” (1800), and to his major fragments of philosophical anthropology, especially “On Religion” and the ’Skizze einer Metaphysik’ “Letter to his Brother, 2 June 1796.” (In contrast, the inclusion of Schiller’s “Kallias Letters” rather than the Letters on Aesthetic Education is an inspired choice, since the Kallias letters are both less troubled by inconsistency--art as instrument of moral education vs. art as an end in itself--and more closely focused on formal devices for achieving unity in poetry than is the more widely known set.)

Novalis is represented by five pieces, “Miscellaneous Remarks” (1797), “Monologue,” “Dialogues” (1798), “On Goethe” (1798), and “Studies in the Visual Arts” (1799), when only the first, plus perhaps some of his “Fichte-Studien”, would do. Novalis has an important historical role in the development of Jena romanticism, and he generally shares Schlegel’s iconoclasm.2 As an aphorist, however, he is far from Schlegel’s equal. Where in Schlegel’s fragments we find a constellation (in Adorno’s sense) of closely related ideas—genius, wit, irony, newness, the fragment, Kant, philosophy—developing from fragment to fragment, we find in Novalis’s fragments much more gnomic and unconnected remarks on the chemical, God, dreaming, and the mystical. The critical writings on Goethe of both Novalis and Schlegel are on the whole more distant from their main theoretical stances on the subject. Schlegel’s “On Goethe’s Meister” (1798) in particular is little more than a plot summary (pp. 269-73), followed by closer accounts of the structures of individual sections, books, and volumes, together with a few comments on the characters (pp. 276-86).

These extra writings—Hamann, Moritz, and the more minor writings of Hölderlin, Schlegel, and Novalis—do not do any harm, and it is perhaps valuable to have them on hand as points of comparison. But they do not help to advance the important and true claim that the major texts here are of current philosophical significance, and the underrepresentation of Hölderlin’s poetological and anthropological writings is a real loss. It would have been good to have on hand also Schiller’s “On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry,” with its more tragic, Hölderlinian sense of human limitation and its unmatched typology of genres of poetic literature (tragedy, comedy, idyll, and elegy) and their distinctive values.

Nonetheless, this volume is now indispensable for anyone working in English on post-Kantian conceptions of the subject, art, and culture. There is no other English-language source available from which to teach these writers as a group. The editor’s introduction is one of the very best summaries of the significance of these writers that is available. It is as good as or better than the very good introductions to Hölderlin by Thomas Pfau and to Schlegel by Rodolphe Gasché, and it is wider than these other two in scope. The case for the importance of German post-Kantian thought about the subject that is begun by the introduction and then completed by the major essays themselves is unassailable. One can hope that the invitation this volume offers to explore the varieties and significances of exercises of “aesthetic reason” will be taken up by philosophers and literary theorists-critics alike; it should be.


1. Dieter Henrich, “Hölderlin in Jena,’ trans. Taylor Carman, in Henrich, The Course of Remembrance and Other Essays on Hölderlin, ed. Eckart Förster (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997), p. 112. Emphasis added.

2. See Charles Larmore, “Hölderlin and Novalis,” in The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, ed. Karl Ameriks (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000), pp. 141-60.