Classify and Label: The Unintended Marginalization of Social Groups

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Matt L. Drabek, Classify and Label: The Unintended Marginalization of Social Groups, Lexington Books, 2014, 146pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739179758.

Reviewed by Saray Ayala, San Francisco State University


The aim of Matt Drabek's book is to show that classifying activities and people can contribute to the marginalization of social groups. In the introduction the author promises to analyze the classificatory practices that we engage in both in our everyday conversations and in the professional practice of science, especially social science. In particular, he aims to provide an analysis of the interaction that occurs between the classification and the classified (i.e., how people change as an effect of classification, and how the classificatory practices change as an effect of people's reactions to them).

The book begins by considering the classification of activities, and how this can bring about marginalization of those activities by changing them and excluding them from the domain of appropriate and acceptable activities. Chapter 2 moves on to the marginalization of people through labeling. In this chapter Drabek introduces an important notion, "feedback bias", which he refers to as "a term that gets at how classificatory work marginalizes people who move through their daily lives in a world altered by the classificatory work, a world where classification alters social norms and public responses to certain types of people" (p. 40, emphasis in the original). Drabek then describes three types of interaction between social scientific classification and the public. The first type occurs between the classificatory system and the individuals who are classified. In this interaction, the system can affect the classified individuals through changing the way people understand themselves. They might reject the classification and contest it, but they might also conform to it to the extent that in some cases the scientific classification creates them anew;. In Hacking's words (1999), our science can sometimes make up people. Following Hacking, Drabek briefly comments on the classification of multiple personality disorder: people classified with this diagnosis might experience their symptoms according to the classification itself (see Hacking 1995; 1998). The second type of interaction occurs between classifications and social norms. Some classifications can change or constitute social norms, either by explicitly articulating norms or, more interestingly, by shaping the social and material forces that constrain what count as normal and acceptable. Finally, the third type of interaction occurs amongst different classificatory systems; one classification, for example, can pave the way for other classifications that were conceptually impossible before.

I find especially interesting Drabek's emphasis on characterizing "feedback bias" as a form of structural bias, as opposed to the much studied cognitive bias. Cognitive biases certainly influence both our folk classificatory practices and the scientific classifications. Scientists' cognitive biases have an important effect on how categories of, e.g., mental conditions are defined, and how people are classified into them. But that is not the whole story behind the marginalization that occurs in those cases, and focusing too much on (explicit or implicit) biases in individuals' minds has the potential of distracting our attention away from other sites in which biases operate (e.g., institutional arrangements). Drabek is interested in identifying and understanding the structural constraints shaping our scientific and folk classifications, and the structural factors operating in the interaction between the classification and the classified (e.g., what a classification affords the individuals classified, what it constrains), rather than the individual attitudes behind particular classificatory systems.

Chapter 3 analyzes how the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM) classifies Sexual Sadism, Sexual Masochism, and Gender Dysphoria, and offers a critical review of how these classifications have changed in the different editions of the DSM. In a brief subsection entitled "Distress", Drabek discusses the difference between endogenous and exogenous distress in psychiatric classification. Distress often appears in the list of criteria for diagnosis of mental disorders. An endogenous distress is immediately caused by the patient's own attitudes, while an exogenous distress is directly caused by others or by society in general. It is important to distinguish between these two cases to be able to exonerate from the psychiatric diagnosis people in distress due to social prosecution/marginalization. In cases of exogenous distress, what needs to be addressed and treated is the social environment, not the individual.

I find especially interesting and significant Drabek's comments on this question. The endogenous/exogenous distinction might seem, at a first glance, enough to solve the question of whether or not a diagnosis is justified, and it is, no doubt, an improvement compared to the lack of such a distinction. But Drabek warns us, following a similar analysis by Jennifer Radden (2004), that the way psychiatrists use these terms just moves the problem one step further. As Drabek explains, for a distress to count as endogenous it is enough that the person has some mental attitude behind it, no matter what the ultimate origin of that attitude is. If the person has internalized social norms that condemn and ostracize them, and it is these norms that cause their distress, the distress counts as endogenous, for the proximal cause can be located inside the person's mind. We certainly internalize social norms and the attitudes of those who surround us, often unaware that we are doing it, and this process of internalization "obscures the ultimate social origin of distress" (p. 75) to the eyes of psychiatrists, and perhaps to our own eyes when we are in distress.

Building on Drabek's brief discussion, we can see that, if this is actually the way the notion of endogenous distress is applied in psychiatric diagnosis, the diagnosis does not tell us much about individuals, other than how embedded they are in the social practices and norms of their community. Applying "endogenous distress" in this way in psychiatric diagnosis leads to a situation in which those who fight social norms without internalizing them and keep themselves outside the normalized social dynamics are exempted from a psychiatric diagnosis, but those who internalize those norms and struggle to abide by them, are considered to have a psychiatric disorder. Empirical research suggests that we are sensitive to norms from a very early age (Tomasello 2009). Children detect norms very quickly and are very keen on imposing them on others and punishing those who do not conform to them. So it seems that our disposition to conform to norms and incorporate them into our understanding of the world and of ourselves might be a very primitive disposition, perhaps at the basis of at least part of our social dynamics. It sounds paradoxical, then, that psychiatric criteria would lead us to diagnose this as a disorder.

Going back to adults, an interesting question to explore is: what makes (most) people internalize social norms? We can speculate that perhaps it is the need to belong to a group; perhaps an intuitive idea according to which there are always some moral values underlying social norms and therefore there are good reasons to conform to them; perhaps the lack of alternatives. In relation to this latter possibility, we could say that if someone is subjected to some form of what Miranda Fricker (2007) called hermeneutical injustice, this person would lack alternative conceptual frameworks to understand their own experience, and therefore the current social norms in their community would appear as necessary. In such a scenario, internalization of the social norms seems the only option. Again, classifying this person as having some kind of disorder sounds misguided, to say the least.

The brief discussion on the endogenous/exogenous distress question seems to me one of the book's highlights. It is crucial for the analysis and explanation of any individual behavior or mental state that we avoid getting stuck in the proximal causes and look beyond them, to the causal history and the structural constraints and affordances shaping that history. This question ties back to the emphasis on structural bias, as opposed to merely focusing on cognitive bias.

Chapter 4 addresses the feminist debate around pornography and gender terms. In it we find an up-to-date review of the question of whether pornography constitutes and causes the subordination of women, or whether it is the platform for a liberatory move. The chapter also reviews the debate around gender terms as a site of oppression or as a site of contestation. Drabek concludes with a discussion of same-sex marriage. He claims his analysis of how classification marginalizes provides a plausible framework for the concern that the label "marriage" might have negative effects on the gay community, bringing with it an ideal of romantic relationship and family that might become a new social norm, marginalizing those who do not conform to it. His hope is that his analysis of classification through labeling provides a framework for liberatory movements more generally.

Drabek's book contributes to the existing literature by providing a detailed catalogue of cases relevant to marginalization through labeling, via descriptions of particular instances of classification and labeling, and their actual marginalizing consequences. However, it does not aim to offer an explanation of the underlying mechanisms and processes that produce these observations. Its scope is rather to document. This lack of emphasis on explanation manifests itself, among other things, in the absence of a criterion to distinguish cases of classification and labeling that bring about marginalization, and cases that bring about liberation instead, or that have neutral effects. For example, what distinguishes the cases of coining and applying labels for sexual paraphilias (discussed in chapter 3) from the case of the application of the label "sexual harassment"? As is well-known by now, coining the term "sexual harassment" helped many people make sense of their experiences. And it helped identify, socially and legally, an important phenomenon that was previously overlooked (although, as Drabek points out on page 44, the label "sexual offender" has also had less desirable effects, due to its being applied to many different kind of crimes).

Drabek wonders "How, then, do we distinguish cases of positive or neutral interactions between classification and the public from the cases of feedback bias?" (p. 43). His admittedly provisional proposal is to say that positive or neutral interactions between classification and people do not serve to marginalize. But given that the book's focus is to analyze how classification sometimes marginalizes, this cannot be his criterion to distinguish classification that marginalizes from that which doesn't, for it would be circular to distinguish the former on the basis of its marginalization effects. Some independent criterion is needed to distinguish positive from negative cases. Such a substantive distinction would help us understand better how marginalization happens. As of now, it remains unclear what the distinctive features of negative cases are, and how exactly they bring about marginalizing effects.

A possible avenue to explore in this regard is examining the role of authority and social position in the classificatory process. Does the person or group putting forward a classificatory system or label need to have some sort of authority for this classification/label to have potential marginalizing effects? It seems reasonable to expect, as Drabek mentions briefly, that when those who make the classification are in a position of power relative to the ones who are classified: "classifying people can lead to the marginalization of the people who are classified" (p. 62). This raises a number of questions: is authority necessary? If so, does authority need to be institutional (granted by some official and formal norms), or can it be gained in informal ways during the very process of classification/labeling? Perhaps exploring these questions in depth could help draw the distinction between negative and positive or neutral effects of classification. The recent literature on hate and oppressive speech would be of much help for developing this project further. In this literature we find a fine-grained distinction of different kinds of authority and of ways of acquiring it (e.g., Langton 2014 and Maitra 2012). We also find alternative analysis of the speaker's power to cause and constitute oppression in which no authority is needed, as in McGowan (2004; 2009).

Overall, this book will serve as a useful resource for readers interested in the topic of how language and classification can harm. By providing a detailed catalogue of cases of marginalization through labeling, it raises many interesting questions that will certainly become fruitful avenues of further research.


Hacking, I. 1999. Making up People. In The Science Studies Reader, Mario Biagioli (ed), 161-71. Routledge.

Hacking, I. 1998. Mad Travelers: Reflections on the Reality of Transient Mental Illnesess. University Press of Virginia.

Hacking I. 1995. Rewriting the Soul: Multiple Personality and The Science of Memory. Princeton University Press.

Fricker, M. 2007. Epistemic Injustice: Power and the Ethics of Knowing. Oxford University Press.

Maitra, Ishani. 2012. Subordinating Speech. In Ishani Maitra and Mary K. McGowan (eds.) Speech and Harm: Controversies Over Free Speech, 94-120. Oxford University Press.

McGowan, Mary K. 2004. Conversational Exercitives: Something Else We Do With Our Words. Linguistics and Philosophy 27 (1): 93–111.

McGowan, Mary K. 2009. Oppressive Speech. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 87 (3): 389-407.

Langton, Rae. 2014. The Authority of Hate Speech. Draft for Analytic Legal Philosophy Conference, Oxford, May 2014.

Tomasello, M. 2009. Why We Cooperate. MIT Press.