Clean Hands? Philosophical Lessons from Scrupulosity

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Jesse S. Summers and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, Clean Hands? Philosophical Lessons from Scrupulosity, Oxford University Press, 2019, 204pp., $62.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190058692.

Reviewed by Noell Birondo, Wichita State University


Philosophical lessons come in many different shapes and sizes. Some lessons are big, some are small. Some lessons go deep and have a big impact, some are shallow and have almost none. Some lessons are not really philosophical at all or would not really be lessons for an audience of academic philosophers. I mention these truisms not to disparage this informative book on 'moral OCD' (moral obsessive-compulsive disorder, or 'Scrupulosity') but rather to emphasize how difficult it can be to discern the book's intended audience, given its interdisciplinary aims and structure. That question is never explicitly addressed (it is admittedly a slim book, slimmer than it appears), but the question has consequences for how to think about the book's ultimate value, and for whom. The book might attract two groups in particular: philosophers working on the nature of responsibility (the subject of the book's longest chapter) and psychiatric researchers or mental health professionals interested in moral philosophy and the philosophy of mental illness. I will return to what moral philosophers can learn from moral OCD, but there will be spoilers.

The book's introduction is followed by eight main chapters plus a very short epigraph (just over one page) on the topic of rationality. The introduction itself focuses on what Jesse S. Summers and Walter Sinnott-Armstrong call "moral psychiatry." Moral psychiatry is not to be confused with moral psychology. The more familiar philosophical subdiscipline of moral psychology investigates "moral judgments and decisions in normal people without psychiatric illnesses" (2). By contrast, moral psychiatry "specifically focuses on mental illnesses whose content is closely related to morality, and it uses those psychiatric conditions to illuminate aspects of morality and to test theories of morality that originated in other fields" (2-3). Previous philosophical work on the implications of psychopathy will give a sense of what the authors have in mind, since psychopathy is another mental disorder in which abnormal moral judgments are clearly essential (3).

What is moral OCD? As Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong see it, moral OCD is a genuine mental illness -- a moral version of someone's compulsively washing her hands, maybe even after her hands become raw, because she is obsessed and anxious about spreading harmful pathogens. Anxiety plays a central role in OCD -- where "anxiety" is understood as "a pathological state in which one's discomfort is unjustified or excessive" (118). What does a specifically moral version of OCD look like? The book provides 11 opening vignettes taken from the psychiatric literature that illustrate the phenomenon in question (ch. 1). Some of the examples are specifically religious, but there is no problem about that: the obsession in play will be moral or religious, and the boundary between the two types of obsession will be porous. Here is an example of each. The first example concerns honesty, a case in which the patient

has obsessive thoughts that a "grocery store cashier may have made an error in favor of the patient." The patient then engages in a compulsion: "Receipts are taken home and laboriously checked item by item, even if the totals involve hundreds of dollars. Some receipts are kept for months, with the patient hoping that the urge to check will eventually decline and he can throw them away." (6)

Another example concerns keeping religious commandments. The subject experiences her visits to museums with her parents as "agony." This is because, in the subject's view, the depictions of people in the paintings "were all graven images." She says that if she were going to look at the paintings, then she "might as well go ahead and build a golden calf." But she placated her parents, who had protested her behavior, by "pretending to look at the artwork; I was actually just looking at the frames" (10). Other examples include obsessions over ritual cleanliness, the full implications of the Golden Rule, and avoiding uncomfortable thoughts about one's naked daughter while changing her diapers, leaving a strain on the balance of parental duties.

In these cases of moral OCD the subject's anxiety about failing to meet some moral or religious standard results in compulsive behavior. Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong observe:

Anxiety -- at least in those with OCD -- makes people focus on what will legitimate or reduce their anxiety. That focus corrupts what might otherwise be a perfectly normal moral judgment, and makes it into something that, at its most corrupted, is plausibly no longer a moral judgment at all. (x, cf. 117-122)

Hence moral OCD can potentially illuminate various aspects of morality, such as the nature of moral judgment. Perhaps it can also shed light on the topic of 'moral saints' -- individuals with "admirable extreme character traits" (60, 77-88). Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong observe, for instance, that St. Ignatius of Loyola and Martin Luther both seemed to exhibit strong indications of moral OCD, an anxiety-based mental disorder, and they briefly entertain this tantalizing possibility: "Do we really want to say that a saint was mentally ill, or that Protestantism or the entire Jesuit order arose out of a mental disease?" (21). But here, as elsewhere in the book, this turns out to be mere tantalization: Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong never discuss why Ignatius and Luther exhibit extreme religious devotion alone, rather than moral OCD. They acknowledge instead that the distinction between extreme religious devotion and mental illness will be unclear in many cases: "Ignoring such complications here, though, it is clear that Scrupulosity is very different from extreme religious devotion and religious extremists are not ipso facto mentally ill," since religious devotion need not be based in anxiety (79-80). The book is not bursting with philosophical revelations.

As for the seven main chapters (after the chapter of vignettes), only three of them are clearly focused on illuminating aspects of morality by examining moral OCD: namely, character, moral judgments, and responsibility (chs. 5-7). The four remaining chapters seem to be aimed, not at moral philosophers (as the book's characterization of 'moral psychiatry' might lead one to expect), but at psychiatric researchers or mental health professionals. These four chapters contain an analysis of the type of obsession involved in general OCD (ch. 2); an analysis of 'moral OCD' that piggy-backs on the DSM-5, but also clearly aims to transcend it (ch. 3); an argument that moral OCD is a genuine mental illness (ch. 4); and a final chapter that addresses two topics: types of treatment for this mental disorder and whether treating people with moral OCD over their objections (specifically their moral objections) is permissible in light of obvious ethical and professional concerns (spoiler: it can be, on grounds of preserving the internal coherence of the subjects' moral views) (ch. 8).

But even in the chapters focused clearly on moral philosophy, one can wonder about the intended audience. For instance, in the chapter on "Character and Virtue," one of the book's shortest, Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong write that:

When we talk about 'character,' this is not what we mean when we say that someone is 'a real character.' Instead, it is what we mean when we say that someone 'has character' or 'has a good character': the person has (or is) a stable, predictably virtuous or admirable character. (80)

This passage, which emphasizes something moral philosophers will certainly know (then partially obscures it), is not unrepresentative. So it does seem to be a fair question: For whom is this book meant to provide philosophical lessons?[1]

Perhaps a better approach is to ask a different question: What lessons can be learned from thinking about moral OCD and who needs to learn those lessons? At the very outset of the book the authors highlight five "important lessons" that can be learned from moral OCD (4-5). I will close by reviewing these five lessons (taken in a different order), and I will briefly indicate responses that draw on parts of the book from deeper in. Readers can assess for themselves whether these are lessons they have to learn:

  1. Moral OCD "raises questions" about whether psychiatric diagnoses of this mental disorder can remain morally neutral (spoiler: they can), and it "raises larger questions about whether psychiatry is or should be morally neutral" (4) (spoiler: it should be).
  2. Moral OCD "raises questions" about the ethics of psychiatric practitioners: "Is this a case of a therapist imposing her own moral views about what's right and wrong on a patient?" (5) (spoiler: it is not, or need not be, as mentioned earlier).

Regarding moral philosophy, Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong mention three important lessons that can be learned here, about character, moral judgment, and responsibility:

  1. They tell us that: "admirable character traits cannot be defined merely by behavior -- and in some cases, not even by a simple account of the person's motivation" (spoiler: this is true -- as emphasized long ago, for instance by Aristotle). Seeing a difference between genuinely admirable character traits and moral OCD "requires looking more carefully at why individuals have that motivation and what other motivations they have or lack" (4) (spoiler: this is also true, given what admirable character traits are: cf. 78).
  2. They tell us that: "moral judgments need to be targeted at (or responsive and reactive to) morally relevant features of acts" and not targeted "at relieving one's own anxiety" (4-5, 117-122) (true: see 3 above).
  3. The last lesson mentioned here is conditional: If we believe that people with moral OCD are less responsible than those without any mental illness (which does indeed seem plausible), then 'reasons-responsiveness' accounts of responsibility "will more easily explain this conclusion," since people with moral OCD lack the ability to respond appropriately to reasons (5, 153-159) (spoiler: this may be so -- but defenders of 'deep-self' accounts of responsibility will wonder why the book's criticisms of such accounts focus mainly on two articles from the 1970s -- path-breaking articles, but still).[2]

In sum, the book provides potentially illuminating observations about central aspects of ethical life (such as moral judgments and character) informed by Summers and Sinnott-Armstrong's own analysis of moral OCD (or 'Scrupulosity') -- and it provides potentially significant observations about reasons-responsiveness accounts of responsibility in light of the plausible idea that people in the grip of moral OCD are less responsible for their disorder-generated actions than those without any mental illness. But it remains unclear whether moral philosophers themselves, as opposed to psychiatric researchers and mental health professionals, will have very much to learn, at least about morality and moral philosophy, from this specific deployment of 'moral psychiatry.'

[1] There are many different ways to deliver philosophical lessons, and the question of audience will always be relevant, as I am especially aware in this context: cf. my "The Virtues of Mestizaje: Lessons from Las Casas on Aztec Human Sacrifice," APA Newsletter on Hispanic/Latino Issues in Philosophy 19:2 (2020).

[2] Harry Frankfurt, "Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person," Journal of Philosophy 68:1 (1971) 5-20; and Gary Watson, "Free Agency" Journal of Philosophy 72:8 (1975) 205-220.