Clitophon's Challenge: Dialectic in Plato's Meno, Phaedo, and Republic

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Hugh H. Benson, Clitophon's Challenge: Dialectic in Plato's Meno, Phaedo, and Republic, Oxford University Press, 2015, 318pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199324835.

Reviewed by David Ebrey, University of Wisconsin-Madison


This book provides a clear and careful account of Plato's method of inquiry in the Meno, Phaedo, and Republic. I highly recommend it to anyone interested in Plato's methodology. Although I have serious disagreements with many of Hugh H. Benson's central claims, I think the book has important insights in every chapter. Moreover, its clarity makes it rewarding to engage with, since even if you disagree with Benson, you can track down why and learn from this process. The central idea of the book is that in the Meno, Phaedo, and Republic Socrates develops and applies a single method of inquiry, the method of hypothesis, which explains how we can acquire knowledge de novo, that is, how we can inquire without relying on someone else with knowledge. The book is devoted to understanding this method and its applications.

Including the introduction, there are nine chapters, which fall into three parts: the first three chapters introduce the project and argue that we do not find a useful method of de novo inquiry before the method of hypothesis in the Meno; the next four chapters develop Benson's main account of the method, drawing from the Meno and Phaedo; in the last two chapters he turns to the Republic, arguing that there is an unappreciated application of the method in Republic V-VI, and arguing for a new role for the method in the divided line.

I found the first part of the book the strongest, although I will only discuss it briefly in order to focus on Benson's central project. As Benson understands Clitophon's challenge, it asks Socrates to explain how we can acquire the sort of knowledge crucially connected with virtue, which Benson calls "virtue-knowledge." He initially frames the book as about how Socrates meets this challenge, but by the second half he stops mentioning virtue-knowledge, and it has simply become about how to acquire philosophical knowledge of any sort. On a separate note, Benson does not come down in favor of a particular way to read the dialogues, but he argues that on either a developmentalist or pedagogical reading they have a certain structure that makes it natural to read the Socratic dialogues before reading the Meno, Phaedo, and Republic. Thus, he speaks of the Socratic dialogues as "before" the Phaedo without making a claim about when they were composed.

The second and third chapters discuss views about how to acquire knowledge that Socrates put forward before the method of hypothesis in the Meno. In the second chapter Benson makes a strong case that Socrates, in the Socratic dialogues, thinks that we could acquire virtue-knowledge from a teacher, if a teacher had such knowledge. I found this one of the strongest chapters and highly recommend it. Benson carefully draws from a number of Socratic dialogues to build a careful account of how Socratic teaching would work, arguing that it would involve students actively engaging with and cross-examining the teacher. But there are still puzzles about teaching, as Benson acknowledges, and there is still the question of what to do without a teacher, so there are still reasons to search for how to inquire de novo. In the third chapter, Benson provides a clear and compelling account of Meno's paradox, the theory of recollection, and the conversation with the slave boy.[1] He ultimately concludes that we do not find here a method of de novo inquiry, so we must wait until later in the Meno to find Socrates' method.

The four chapters that discuss the Meno and the Phaedo form the heart of the book. First Benson argues that the "method of hypothesis" is not described as a mere second best in the Meno and Phaedo (chapter 4). Then he builds up an account of this method in these dialogues, using a "conservative approach" that starts simply with Plato's description of the method in each dialogue (chapter 5) before turning to the applications of the method (chapter 6 and 7). It is not clear that this is a conservative approach. Why not think that each method should first be understood within the overall context of its respective dialogue, before comparing them to decide if they are the same? Benson thinks that his approach helps us understand the applications of the method better, because we understand the method before we consider each application. But this is only true if the same method is applied in both places. In fact, I was not convinced that the two dialogues are describing even similar methods, for reasons I explain below.[2] I will first argue against Benson's view using his own procedure, that is, using the descriptions of the method within each dialogue, without their applications.

In the Meno Socrates describes "considering on a hypothesis whether virtue is teachable or whatever," which he explains using what is widely agreed to be an example of geometrical analysis and synthesis (86e-87b). As Benson agrees, this use of analysis and synthesis involves reducing one question to another: reducing the question of whether a given area can be inscribed into a circle as a triangle to the question of whether the area has a specific property. In a similar way, Socrates reduces the question of whether virtue is teachable to the question of whether it is knowledge, so that if virtue is knowledge, it is teachable, and if not, not.

In the Phaedo Socrates describes the process of "hypothesizing in each case the logos [account] I judged most robust" (100a) in the context of discussing his alternative to the type of natural science done by early Greek philosophers and Hippocratic authors. This method involves putting forward as a hypothesis a logos and considering as true whatever harmonizes with it and as false whatever does not. There is no obvious original question and no obvious reduced question here. Benson claims that the original question is "What is the aitia [cause] of generation and corruption?" (132). One must wait sixty pages to discover what he thinks the reduced question is: "What things are there?" (196). This question is never mentioned in the Phaedo. Benson concedes that, unlike in the Meno, the original question in the Phaedo is not a yes/no question (134-135). But that does not seem to me to be the main difficulty. You could reduce one question with four options to another with four options. The point of this use of the geometer's technique is to reduce one question to another completely, so that we no longer need to pursue the old question. That is what makes the geometer's technique powerful, and, at least on the face of it, that is what is powerful about Socrates reducing the question of whether virtue is teachable to the question of whether it is knowledge. After performing this reduction in the Meno, Socrates says, "so next, it seems, we must consider whether virtue is knowledge or something other than knowledge" (87c, emphasis mine), just as in geometry the next question is whether or not the area has the property in question.

But there is nothing like that in the method of the Phaedo. We are not told what the result is if forms do not exist. Benson acknowledges that there is no strict reduction in the Phaedo. He says that Socrates has a "less precise and determinate" (138) notion of reducing one question to another in the Phaedo. But that seems to abandon what is powerful about the geometer's technique described in the Meno. Benson draws his account of the "less precise and determinate" form of reduction from Socrates' claim that we must count as true what harmonizes with our hypothesis. He argues that the hypothesis is that there is, e.g., a form of the beautiful, and what harmonizes with it is that this form is the cause of things being beautiful. While this seems to me correct, Socrates also says that we should count as true whatever harmonizes with the hypothesis, both about a cause and about everything else (100a). On Benson's account the method gives no role to considering as true all the many different things that harmonize with the logos; it only involves considering as true the answer to the original question that harmonizes with the reduced question. On Benson's reading, the Phaedo has a less precise application of the reduction technique described in the Meno and the Phaedo is trying to reduce one question to another when it considers all the different things that harmonize with the hypothesis. Why not think, instead, that they are simply different techniques?

Benson's approach relies on the idea that if we put together the different things Socrates says about procedures that involve a hypothesis, we will arrive at a better method. But it is not clear why we should expect that. On Benson's reading, the method of hypothesis involves two stages: one of reducing one question to another (drawn from the Meno) and accepting the hypothesis that seems strongest to you (drawn from the Phaedo) and another stage (drawn from the Phaedo) of testing whether its hormêthenta agree with each other or not, and reducing this to a yet higher hypothesis.[3] (Benson does not translate hormêthenta, but he says that it means the "things that start from this hypothesis" (144), which should be considered less strict than logical consequences.) Reducing one question to another is a powerful technique. Another powerful technique is putting forward a hypothesis and considering as true whatever harmonizes with it and as false whatever does not, and then testing the hypothesis by seeing whether its consequences harmonize with each other. But is a method of inquiry stronger if it does both of these things? It seems to me, if anything, weaker, since in some cases reduction is a powerful tool, but we are not trying to test an overall account, whereas in other cases we want to test an overall account that we did not arrive at through reduction. What is gained by combining these into a single method?

On Benson's reading, in the Phaedo we are not given an example of testing whether a hypothesis' hormêthenta harmonize, but we do find one in the Meno. This, then, is supposed to be something gained by Benson's approach: we can fill in puzzling parts from the Phaedo using the Meno. Benson claims that we see the testing stage in the Meno when Socrates presents his argument that virtue is not teachable, which is supposed to test the hypothesis that virtue is knowledge. You test this hypothesis by looking for whether its hormêthenta harmonize with each other. Benson argues that one hormêthen of virtue being knowledge is that there are (or are likely to be) teachers of virtue, and another hormêthen is that there are no teachers of virtue.[4] On Benson's reading, the failure of these hormêthenta to harmonize is why Socrates rejects the hypothesis that virtue is knowledge near the end of the Meno. Benson thinks Socrates was likely wrong to reject the hypothesis, but nonetheless he thinks that this gives us a model of how the method is supposed to work. As for why it is a hormêthen of virtue's being knowledge that there are no teachers of virtue, on Benson's account the hormêthenta of the hypothesis that virtue is knowledge include

not just those hormêthenta which follow in a vaguely logical way from the hypothesis, but also all those observations, sayings, or common opinions (endoxa) -- phainomena -- appropriately associated with virtue and knowledge, the component forms or concepts of the hypothesis (174).

On this account, empirical observations and endoxa related to a hypothesis, such as those that lead us to think that there are no teachers of virtue, count as hormêthenta of that hypothesis. It might seem very strange to think that in any sense it "starts from" -- is a hormêthen of -- virtue's being knowledge that there are no teachers of virtue, but Benson thinks this simply helps us understand what Socrates means by hormêthenta.

This is a case where Benson's "conservative approach" seems to me to lead him astray. I think rather than drawing from the Meno to understand the Phaedo's talk of hormêthenta harmonizing, we can find a better account within the Phaedo. There Socrates considers the logos that the soul is a harmony, he calls this a "hypothesis" (93c, 94b), and he talks about what works in concert with this logos (92c). We can use this example to develop an account of what it means for the hormêthenta of a hypothesis to harmonize.[5] Socrates says, for example, that a soul does not come in degrees whereas a harmony does come in degrees (93a-94b). This gives us a model of the hormêthenta of a hypothesis failing to harmonize: the consequences of being a soul are incompatible with those of being a harmony, thus we reject the hypothesis that the soul is a harmony. In the middle of Socrates' discussion of the method of hypothesis he seems to use this same sort of procedure to evaluate the account that a head is the cause of someone's being large. The fact that a head can equally well explain someone's being small is not compatible with the general fact that a cause should not be able to explain one thing just as well as its opposite (101a-b). The consequences of being a head are incompatible with those of being a cause, so we reject this as a causal account. By contrast, the hypothesis that there is a form of largeness will never face a similar problem, since it will never be the cause of something's being small (101a). As we saw, on Benson's account, hormêthenta are not just vaguely logical consequences, but also endoxa and phainomena associated with the hypothesis. It seems to me, instead, that there are resources within the Phaedo to find an account of testing the hormêthenta that is more precise and determinate. Again, by trying to fit the Meno into the framework of the Phaedo, we end up with a method that is weaker than what is found individually in each dialogue.

While I disagree with several of Benson's main claims, I was convinced by many arguments in these central chapters. For example, I think Benson deftly cuts through scholarly controversy about what the hypothesis is in the Phaedo, making a strong case that the hypothesis is that there are forms, and that it is a consequence of this that they are causes (193-204). He offers a new, and I think persuasive, proposal for why Socrates refers to plural hypotheses at the end of the final immortality argument, arguing that this refers back to Socrates' earlier claim that one separately hypothesizes the existence of each form. This is just one example of the rich and detailed argumentation found throughout the book.

Let me turn finally to Benson's treatment of the Republic, in which he applies the basic account of the method of hypothesis that he has developed, refining it in a few different ways. Benson argues that there is an application of the method of hypothesis in Republic V-VI in which Socrates reduces the question of whether the kallipolis is possible to the question of whether political power is the same as philosophy. Rather than focus on that, I will focus on his reading of the divided line in his final chapter. He argues that the divided line primarily focuses on methodology, not ontology. And he argues that the last two subsections of the line describe, respectively, the incorrect and correct ways to apply the method of hypothesis. He notes that the method described in both parts involve starting from a hypothesis. One difference is that the person engaged in dialectic, in the best part of the line, first reaches an unhypothetical first principle, then uses this to argue for her conclusion. By contrast, the person lower on the line skips this step and so, Benson argues, misapplies the method. On Benson's reading, to correctly reach the conclusion, you must go to the higher, unhypothetical first principle, prove that your original question follows from this principle, and then test your hypothesis' hormêthenta.

Benson treats dialectic, the method employed in the best part of the line, as only involving a correct application of the method of hypothesis. But there seem to be two processes that happen in sequence, and only the first is a possible application of the method of hypothesis. The first process treats hypotheses as hypotheses and reaches the unhypothetical first principle; the other process start with having grasped the genuine, unhypothetical starting point, and then involves coming down without using anything perceptible at all, only using "forms themselves moving through forms to forms, ending in forms" (511b-c). Benson treats all of this, taken together, as an application of the method of hypothesis. The first stage results in reaching and grasping the unhypothetical first principle. Benson agrees that calling something a hypothesis indicates that it is not known; grasping the unhypothetical first principle, then, certainly suggests coming to know it. But on Benson's account we have not acquired any knowledge when we grasp the unhypothetical first principle; we must still go down from the unhypothetical first principle to derive the original question sought and we must confirm our hypothesis from its hormêthenta. But that seems to treat grasping an unhypothetical first principle the same way as grasping a hypothesis. And in fact, Benson says that Socrates simply switches from discussing a sufficient (hikanon) hypothesis in the Phaedo to discussing an unhypothetical first principle in the Republic. But if that were what Socrates wanted to suggest, why would he say that you have reached and grasped something unhypothetical? Why would he say that after grasping this unhypothetical first principle one does not use anything whatsoever that is perceptible? What Socrates seems to be describing instead, at a high level of generality, is the sort of de novo inquiry that you will be able to engage in once you have truly grasped the form of the good.

I am led to conclude that, contra Benson, a conservative approach reveals importantly different uses of hypotheses to inquire in the Meno, Phaedo, and Republic. Seeing these as separate avoids strained readings of passages and provides separate techniques that are each more clearly and precisely defined than the method we arrive at by combining all three. The resulting picture, I think, provides a richer and more interesting account of Plato's methodology in these dialogues. We find Plato exploring a range of methodological options, and perhaps ultimately revising his views. Whether or not this is correct, we can learn quite a bit from Benson's rich and detailed treatment of philosophical methodology in these dialogues.[6]

[1] It is perhaps not surprising that I find it compelling, since Benson's account is the closest to my own, found in "Meno's Paradox in Context" British Journal of the History of Philosophy, 22 (2014).

[2] Full disclosure: I have a horse in this race, having argued that they are distinct in "A New Philosophical Tool in the Meno" Ancient Philosophy 33 (2013). I provide different reasons for thinking they are distinct in this review.

[3] On Benson's account, one always must look for a higher hypothesis when initially applying the method. He does not argue for this; however, he does translate ἐπειδὴ δὲ ἐκείνης αὐτῆς δέοι σε διδόναι λόγον, ὡσαύτως ἂν διδοίης, as "And when you must give an account of your hypothesis itself you will assume another hypothesis, the one which seems to you best of the higher ones until you come to something adequate" (140). But this translation does not capture the force to the optatives. We should translate it as something like, "and if you should have to, at some time, give an account of your hypothesis itself, you would assume another hypothesis . . ." The Greek does not presuppose that there will be a time when you are forced to give an account of your hypothesis itself.

[4] At one point (173) Benson suggests that rather than it being a hormêthen that there are no teachers of virtue, it is more accurate to say that eight statements from the Meno together are the hormêthenta, and it seems to follow from these that there are no teachers of virtue. My concerns apply to this formulation as well.

[5] I am here inspired by an unpublished paper by David Sedley, who first drew my attention to the relevance of Socrates' reply to Simmias for understanding the method of hypothesis.

[6] I would like to think Emily Fletcher, Naoya Iwata, and Joe Karbowski for comments on earlier drafts.