Cogito?: Descartes and Thinking the World

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Joseph Almog, Cogito?: Descartes and Thinking the World, Oxford University Press, 2008, 120pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195337716.

Reviewed by Kurt Smith, Bloomsburg University of Pennsylvania


Almog's Cogito? is a sequel to his earlier book What Am I? (Oxford, 2002). Together, the two books attempt to make some philosophical sense out of Descartes's famous phrase found in the Latin version of the Discourse On Method, "cogito ergo sum" -- I think, therefore I am. Though a sequel, the book stands on its own, and can be studied independently of the first book.

Cogito? is a first-rate philosophical examination of a constellation of concepts that Almog finds lurking in the work of the seventeenth-century thinker René Descartes. The puzzle that motivates Almog's project is what he calls "Descartes' thinking-man paradox" (pp. 3-19), which goes as follows: The proposition, "cogito," is for Descartes "the most immediate and evident of all propositions" (p. 3), and yet it is one of the "oddest propositions" he (i.e., Almog) can think of. For, "how can there be, in this otherwise absolutely thought-deprived cosmos, acts-of-thinking?" (p. 4). So, the paradox seems to be that even though the truth of "cogito" is immediate and evident to me, I am at a loss as to how it could be true, given a materialistic conception of the cosmos. Of course, the paradox has traction only if Descartes construed "nature" in this materialistic sense. Oddly, Almog seems ready to admit that Descartes did not construe nature in this sense (pp. 58-9). If he's right (and he is), it follows that the paradox (the very thing motivating Almog's book) loses traction -- here, about mid-way through the book.

No doubt, a reader familiar with Descartes's work will initially think that Almog has stumbled onto a version of the mind-body problem. In line with his earlier study, however, Almog is clear to note that the problem, as it has been traditionally formulated, has only arisen as a result of a profound misunderstanding of Descartes (p. 7). In Cogito? he attempts to correct this misunderstanding. But, here is exactly where I have trouble with Almog's project, for in order to pull this off he must engage in a serious historical study, something he seems to have no interest in doing. As I see it, for Almog to convince his audience that his reading of Descartes is something that makes sense (for Descartes), he must look beyond the few primary texts he considers in the book, and what is more, whether he likes it or not, must look at what other scholars (who have engaged in the historical study) have said. Given the subject matter of the book, he should have discussed Rozemond's Descartes's Dualism (Harvard, 1998), or Alanen's Descartes's Concept of Mind (Harvard, 2003), filling us in on how he thinks they got Descartes all wrong. Or, since he argues that Descartes is best read in light of certain nineteenth- and twentieth-century thinkers (e.g., Frege and Russell), he should have at the very least considered Baker and Morris's Descartes' Dualism (Routledge, 1996), for in that book Baker and Morris argue against reading Descartes in light of such interpreters as Russell. And though others have been willing to give Almog a pass on this front (see Della Rocca's and Yablo's respective exchanges with Almog in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 70, Issue No. 3, May 2007, pp. 701-08, 709-16), I am not so willing. If the book is about Descartes, about the historical figure, then whether Almog likes it or not he must accept the demands imposed on the scholar engaged in doing an historical study -- period.

That being said, like other critics I am more than willing to give to Almog (or to anyone for that matter) any needed wiggle-room, historically speaking, if that is what is needed in order to get the philosophical discussion up and running. This concession does not extend so far as to ignore important historical facts. Since some of the elements of Almog's argument are historical elements, he must recognize them as such -- conceding wiggle-room will not release him from this. Let me mention a few things.

The least troubling of these (though still troubling), I think, arises in a discussion about the methods of analysis and synthesis:

Through and through, I emphasize to the class that this methodology followed a particular "flow diagram" that I characterized, following Descartes, as the analytic method, or, using my own terms, the procession from axioms to theorems (p. 11).


Having made a repertoire of the basic facts of nature and the natures of the involved constituents (what kind of thing each item is), I suggest to the class that we read the first few Meditations using what Descartes calls the synthetic method or, using my own terms, the method of deriving axioms from theorems (p. 12).

Almog gets Descartes wrong here. Synthesis, Descartes says, begins with axioms and moves to deriving (among other things) theorems; it is the demonstration from premise to conclusion (AT VII 156;CSM II 110-11). Prompted by an objector, in synthetic style Descartes lays out a "geometrical exposition" of the content of the Meditations in the Second Replies (AT VII 160-70; CSM II 113-20). By contrast, concerning analysis, Descartes notes that "it was this method alone which I employed in my Meditations" (AT VII 156; CSM II 111), a method that begins with a proposition, and aims at discovering what more basic propositions may underwrite it. In terms of theorems and axioms, we start with a theorem and then try to discover what axioms underwrite it. So, what Almog calls synthesis, Descartes calls analysis; and what Almog calls analysis, Descartes calls synthesis.

A more troubling remark comes when Almog rejects the traditional reading of Descartes's reference to Archimedes. Traditionally, Descartes's reference to an Archimedean point is taken as a metaphor from ancient mechanics -- the point is the fulcrum point of a lever, which is immovable and makes physically possible one's being able to move heavy objects. As Descartes tells the story, "Archimedes used to demand just one firm and immovable point in order to shift the entire earth" (AT VII 24; CSM II 16). And yet Almog says that, according to his encyclopedia, Archimedes did not mean this, but rather meant:

A vantage point from which an observer can objectively perceive the subject of inquiry, with a view of totality. The ideal is of "removing oneself" from the object of study so that one can see it in relation to all other things (p. 14).

And, what is more, this is how we should really understand Descartes's use of Archimedes. But, wait … what encyclopedia? This interpretation of Archimedes is found in an entry on Wikipedia. "Certainly this wasn't Almog's source," I thought to myself. So, who thinks that this is what Archimedes meant? I consulted several experts in ancient philosophy, who did not recognize the source of this take on Archimedes. One wondered whether it might be found in Plutarch. Another wondered whether it had its origin in Pappus. But none recognized it off-hand. To me, it looked like something Richard Rorty would say. What Almog needed to do, I think, was first tell us his source (not just mention that he was using some encyclopedia) and establish that it was what Archimedes meant. Once he had done this, he would need to show how the traditional reading (which takes Descartes's reference to mechanics seriously) got it wrong, and establish that this other take on Archimedes is what Descartes took Archimedes to say. But, Almog spends no time establishing either of these two historical elements -- elements that are essential to his main argument.

My last example, the most troubling of the three mentioned here, is Almog's reading of Descartes's use of objective mode of being or way of being in the mind. Descartes is notorious for adopting scholastic terminology, though in some instances showing little or no concern over how such terms were actually used in the schools. Caterus, author of the First Objections, focuses specifically on Descartes's use of the term "objective being" (AT VII 92-3; CSM II 66-7), a kind of being attributed to ideas insofar as they represent things (AT VII 42; CSM II 29). Descartes replies to Caterus by saying that "the idea of the sun is the sun itself existing in the intellect -- not of course formally existing, as it does in the heavens, but objectively existing, i.e., in the way in which objects are normally in the intellect" (AT VII 102; CSM II 75). With the sole exception of Hoffman's work on this, Almog ignores the past two decades of serious scholarly work on this exchange (ignoring the important work of Margaret Wilson, Vere Chappell, Tom Lennon, Steven Nadler, and Larry Nolan, to name several) and says that the sun has two modes of being -- formal and objective modes of being. Formally, the sun is taken to exist in the heavens; objectively, the sun is taken to exist in the intellect. Here Almog argues that the sun existing in the intellect is a way of being the sun. I will explain.

Making reference to certain (medieval?) models of efficient causation, Almog argues:

The sun impacts the rocks and the plants and the cats. But it also impacts human brains and thus, and only thus, the interlocked human minds. Each of the foregoing things -- rock, plant, cat, man -- are en-lightened targets -- they all have the one and only sun in them. The differences lie rather in how these sun-processors come to have it, especially on the last leg from the sun -- as we hit the surface of the rock or the depths of a mind. Of course, photosynthesis is one way of having the sun (in a flower); tanned skin is another way of having the sun (in my body). Finally, forming a visual image of the sun is a way for my mind (via my processing brain) to have the sun in it (p. 30).

As is well known, although Descartes will talk about the sun and other sorts of "natural" objects in his philosophical discussions, in the end he does not appear to hold that such a corporal thing actually possessed a nature that would distinguish it from some other corporeal thing -- at least not in the sense that an Aristotelian would have cast it (the sun is hot, round, yellow, and so on). Rather, the sun, if it has a nature, is essentially extended in length, breadth, and depth. In fact, the sun has the very same nature, if that is what we want to call it, as the moon, a rock, a plant, and a cat. Aristotelian natural kinds do not appear to play any serious role in Descartes's metaphysics. So, one needs to be careful when dealing with that stuff about the sun.

As an aside, I see a potential philosophical problem with Almog's allowing the sun to be metaphysically independent of other things. What I have in mind is his casting the idea of the sun as a way of the sun's being in a mind. The problem is this: isn't the sun caused by something -- I don't know, call it A? So, according to the view of efficient causation that Almog attributes to Descartes, isn't the sun simply a way of being A? So, why isn't my idea an idea of A instead of an idea of the sun? And, if God is ultimately the efficient cause of all things, and so all things are ways of being God, why aren't all my ideas ideas of God? I do not see this as a problem for Descartes (because I neither attribute this model of causation nor this reading of objective being to him), but I do see this as a problem for Almog's Descartes.

The above photosynthesis reading of the phrase way of being in a mind leads Almog to his final point, which is an answer to the thinking-man paradox. Thinking, understood as the way things are in a mind, "makes us interact with the rest of nature -- have its objects in our minds -- by a natural process" (p. 95). Almog uses the way of being in concept to go the other way. So, we have the above reading: when the sun causes the rock to get hot, its being hot is a way of the sun's being in the rock; likewise when the sun causes me to think (about?) it, my thinking it is a way of the sun's being in my mind. By contrast (this is the other reading), the rock's being hot was potentially in the sun all along. Likewise, thinking-the-sun was potentially in the sun all along. Like the great oak is potentially in the acorn:

[I]t is in the nature of the cosmos -- was right there in the early quarks and leptons and the emerging spatiotemporal manifold -- that nature were to generate, in time, life forms, which, in turn, at later times, were to bring about the higher forms that the gorillas and the orcas make … It was all -- thinking men included -- right in there from the very origin. "In there," to borrow from Frege, not as bricks are in a house but as flowers are in the seeds (pp. 95-6).

So, thinking-man has been potentially in the cosmos all along. Like the oak comes from the acorn, thinking-man, or more specifically, thought, arises from … what? … the cosmos? But for Almog the cosmos is a material cosmos -- it is a materialistic conception of nature. So, is Almog arguing for an emergent theory of mind -- a theory that says that mind is in some sense inherent in matter? Personally, I like what Almog is saying here, and it certainly may be a view that is "in the air" in the seventeenth-century, but not as something attributable to the historic figure, Descartes. For starters, wouldn't this give metaphysical priority to body -- that is, wouldn't this view tell us that mind depends for its being on the being of body? If so, this doesn't sound like Descartes (look at what he says to Hobbes and to Arnauld with respect to their raising the possibility that one's mind depends on -- arises from? -- one's body). And thus Almog has much more to show, much more than he shows in Cogito?, in order to convince us that this was Descartes's view.