Cognition and Perception: How Do Psychology and Neural Science Inform Philosophy?

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Athanassios Raftopoulos, Cognition and Perception: How Do Psychology and Neural Science Inform Philosophy?, MIT Press, 2009, 419pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262013215.

Reviewed by Jack Lyons, University of Arkansas



Athanassios Raftopoulos offers an extended articulation and defense of the claim that perception is cognitively encapsulated, and uses this to answer several longstanding problems in philosophy. In Part I, he brings together a great deal of recent empirical work to argue that an early stage of vision — he calls this “perception” — is cognitively encapsulated. Early vision delivers representations with nonconceptual content, which is not (directly) modulated by the beliefs, goals, theories, etc. of the organism. There is, therefore, a psychologically real distinction between perception in this technical sense and these higher cognitive states — to which he restricts the term “cognition”. Hence the title of the book: cognition and perception, thus construed, are nonoverlapping. In Part II, Raftopoulos argues that his theory of perception can help us to spell out a detailed account of what nonconceptual content is, to determine empirically the content of these nonconceptual states (without having to rely entirely on introspection), to understand perceptual reference, to explain how perceptual states can stand in epistemic support relations to observation beliefs, to debunk claims about the theory-ladenness of perception, and to undermine the anti-realist philosophy of science that such theory-ladenness would support. The cognitive science of Part I is put to the service of epistemic optimism in Part II.

It is an ambitious and impressive book, one that draws on a broad and deep knowledge of disparate literatures in philosophy, psychology, and neuroscience.

In the three chapters that make up Part I, Raftopoulos examines a number of empirical studies that converge on a general model of visual perception. Synthesizing cognitive psychological studies by Rensinck, Lamme, and others, as well as a wide range of PET, ERP, and single-cell studies undertaken by a number of researchers over the last fifteen years or so, an overall theory emerges:

Visual information is first processed in an entirely bottom-up manner during a feedforward sweep phase; a local recurrent phase follows, during which there is top-down and lateral processing, but it is local in the sense that it is all still preattentive (with a qualification to be noted shortly): the task demands and thus the goals, expectations, and other “cognitive” states of the organism don’t affect processing until later. The results of the local recurrent phase are short-lived, unstable representations, delivered in parallel, and carrying information at roughly the level of Marr’s 2½D sketch; motion, color, orientation, and spatial locations and relations of surfaces and objects are represented. These representations constitute phenomenal consciousness, in Block’s (1995) sense. Objects (better: “proto-objects”, to emphasize the low level of processing) are segregated and individuated at this early stage on the basis of spatiotemporal features, although object identification occurs later and requires attention and application of concepts and cognitive resources.

“Perception” gives way to late vision when object-centered attention comes into play with the global recurrent phase. This phase involves input from frontal and prefrontal areas, as well as mnemonic circuits. Object-centered attention selects among the unstable representations produced by early vision, choosing some for further processing. The result is the familiar product of late vision: a stable percept with conceptual content, including information about object identity, function, etc. (One of several possible terminological confusions is apparent here: a “percept” is not the product of “perception” but rather of “late vision”, which is a species of “cognition”.) Access consciousness, or report awareness, also requires attention and therefore occurs during late vision; it lags behind phenomenal consciousness and has a very different content, in part because of the additional processing involved.

There are two kinds of attentional effects in vision: the object-centered attention just discussed biases processing in accordance with task demands, subject’s expectations, etc., but this top down influence does not occur until after the local recurrent phase is finished. Spatial attention, on the other hand, does have early effects on processing, but it only affects the amount of processing devoted to a given region of space; it does not bias the interpretation of the contents of that region. Object-centered attention biases processing by modulating the activity of the same neural regions involved in early vision, boosting the activation of certain feature detectors in accordance with cognitive input, but not until after a bottom-up processing phase is completed. Spatial attention primes all the feature detectors for a given spatial location, irrespective of which features they detect. It thus alters where we look, but not what we see when we look there. Neither, therefore, is it a threat to the theory-neutrality, or cognitive encapsulation, of perception. Object-centered attention affects content but is post-perceptual, and spatial attention is preperceptual and doesn’t affect content.

The overall view, therefore, converges on a view defended by Pylyshyn (2003): though vision is not informationally encapsulated, or theory-neutral, there is a stage of vision that is — namely, early vision, or “perception”. Some impatient readers may be tempted to skip Part I and get right to the more traditionally philosophical concerns of Part II, but they would do themselves a disservice. This is not just science journalism; it is not a warmed-over rehash of Pylyshyn’s, or anyone else’s, work; it is a careful, well-informed, and convincing effort to elaborate and defend a general theory of vision.

In Part II, this theory is applied to a number of more distinctively philosophical problems. In Chapter 4, Raftopoulos uses the theory to argue for a nonconceptualism regarding the content of perceptual experience. The discussion here hardly touches on the well-worn debate about demonstrative concepts and the like (McDowell 1994), but uses the cognitive science to argue for and clearly specify a version of nonconceptualism. In Chapter 5, he argues that the perceptual states have genuine content (i.e., correctness conditions) and are representational in a fairly strict sense of the term (Bermudez 1995). He argues that conceptual and nonconceptual content are thoroughgoingly distinct and offers a more detailed explanation of the specific content of the latter (3D representations are out, though Gibsonian affordances — for reasons that are never made clear to me — are in). He also appeals in this chapter to the nonconceptual representational states as a way out of the Myth of the Given.

Chapter 6 is concerned with perceptual reference; nonconceptual representations and deictic pointers (Ballard et al. 1997) are offered as part of a solution to the symbol grounding problem (Harnad 1990). The content of conceptual representations is grounded in that of nonconceptual representations, and a middle path is taken between descriptivist and direct reference theories. Chapter 7 turns to the well-known Fodor/Churchland debate about encapsulation (Fodor 1984, 1988; Churchland 1988). The result is that both are mistaken: vision is neither fully encapsulated nor fully theory-laden. Again, early vision is encapsulated (so Churchland is wrong), but “observation” (late vision) is theory-infected (so Fodor is wrong). Still, the final conclusion is largely Fodorian, since the perceptual states on which observations are based result from entirely bottom-up processing. Perceptual learning — which makes its first appearance surprisingly late in the book — is no argument for theory-ladenness, because it involves only data driven changes. Perceptual states are not independent of one’s experiences, but they are independent of one’s theory; we can check on each other’s perceptions without adopting their theory. Such a conclusion has obvious consequences for the anti-realist philosophy of science that is supposed to follow from the theory-ladenness of perception. This is taken up in Chapter 8. Scientists with different theoretical commitments can still perceive the same thing, even though what they observe will be different. Raftopoulos holds that true belief is not sufficient for realism; we must also show that our nonconceptual perceptions carve up the world appropriately. He argues (via inference to the best explanation) that even this stronger requirement for realism can be satisfied.

Some readers will already be familiar with his view concerning nonconceptual content, as much of this appears already in Raftopoulos and Müller (2006). Raftopoulos claims that the content of perception is nonconceptual precisely because it is causally insulated from cognitive/conceptual capacities. Thus, the argument for encapsulation of Part I resolves the debate about nonconceptual content. It is fairly common to define nonconceptual content in something like the following terms: a contentful state has nonconceptual content just in case one could be in that state without having any concepts. Taking this statement at face value and conjoining Raftopoulos’s theory of vision, the existence of nonconceptual content follows immediately, for the outputs of early vision are representational states, and one’s perceptual processes do not rely in any way on conceptual processes or representations. This is an important move, although many readers surely will not like it. One response that will tempt the conceptualist at this point is to deny that these states have genuine content. Raftopoulos argues at length that they do, however, and the conceptualist will have to take these arguments seriously.

Raftopoulos’s theory is unusual in that he makes nonconceptuality a matter of causal independence rather than constitutive independence. Given his understanding of nonconceptual content, there is no reason why the nonconceptual representations could not have the very same contents as concepts. They generally don’t, but that is because our concepts generally cut the world at a fairly course grain, and because attention transforms the unstable representations in the course of constructing a stable percept. On the other hand, his requirements for nonconceptual content are quite strict. If, say, 3D shape information is encoded by visually proprietary representations, where the agent has no concepts corresponding to these representations, Raftopoulos will apparently not count these 3D shape representations as nonconceptual, because 3D shape extraction is conceptually mediated, even if not conceptually encoded. This may seem like changing the subject, but it brings a welcome clarity and precision to a messy literature. If it is a change, it may very well be a welcome one.

It is worrisome that the perceptual states on which Raftopoulos puts so much weight — the non-coherent nonconceptual outputs of early vision — are the lightly and quickly processed, non-coherent, fleeting states of phenomenal consciousness postulated as the end products of early vision. An alternative view, one with a great deal of methodological and substantive affinity to his, is one that appeals to the outputs of late vision instead of the outputs of early vision (Lyons 2009).

One problem with the early vision view is simply that the nonconceptual contents do not match up in the appropriate way with the beliefs that they are supposed to justify, the latter being conceptual. Conceptualists frequently haven’t articulated this very well, but experiences are supposed to play a particular sort of justificatory role. Unlike reliability, coherence, and other purported justificatory factors, perceptual experiences are supposed to serve as evidence, as reasons, for perceptual beliefs. Conceptualists (and others) are worried that experiences cannot play this evidential role vis-à-vis conceptualized beliefs, if these experiences don’t have conceptual content. Some conceptualists (e.g., Brewer 1999, McDowell 1994) seem to think that experiences couldn’t play an evidential role if they had any nonconceptual content. I see no reason to think this is true but still share the conceptualist’s worry about experiences that have no conceptual content. Not everyone shares these worries, but Raftopoulos tries to assuage those who do by arguing that the products of early vision are genuinely contentful and genuinely representational and therefore are “loaded with structure” (p. 194). But the problem here is semantical, not syntactical. It is, perhaps, easy to see how having an experience as of P can make it reasonable to one to believe that P, but experiences and beliefs have different contents for Raftopoulos. So he has to explain why having an experience as of Q makes it reasonable for one to believe that P — even though one does not have the belief that Q indicates P (and normally couldn’t, since Q is nonconceptual). The problem is not, as conceptualists sometimes seem to think, that nonconceptual experiences don’t have content and thus can’t play an evidential role; it’s that they don’t have the right content to play the specified evidential role.

Such Sellarsian-type arguments aside, it seems that early visual states epistemically underdetermine the corresponding beliefs. It is overwhelmingly plausible that when I look at a horse, it is reasonable for me to believe that it’s a horse because it looks like a horse. But looking like a horse is something that happens in late vision (which computes 3D shape information and object identity), not early vision. You and I might have identical 2½D sketches, but the thing looks like a horse to me and not to you because my late visual system is intact and yours is not. Surely this accounts for why I am justified in thinking it’s a horse and you are not (Lyons 2005, 2009).

Finally, it is not at all clear that perceptual states, as Raftopoulos construes them, would be much use to the typical internalist epistemologist after all. Internalism is often founded on the conviction that one should have conscious access to the grounds on which one’s beliefs are held (Alston 1988), or that the justifying states be such that the agent can tell, by mere introspection, whether or not she is in them (Chisholm 1989). It is not clear that the phenomenally conscious states delivered through early vision will play either of these roles. Recall that, for Raftopoulos, phenomenal consciousness arises from the local recurrent processing phase, which offers up fleeting and unstable representations with nonconceptual content. Because of the instability, these states are difficult to isolate in experience (p. 169). Furthermore, once we turn our attention to our phenomenal experience, the global recurrent phase kicks in and alters that experience, not only because attention brings conceptual content into play, but also because attention triggers further processing of the proto-objects of phenomenal consciousness. Raftopoulos is insistent that conceptual content is not just nonconceptual content with the addition of concepts. One of several important products of Part I is his theory about the relation between phenomenal consciousness and access consciousness. It is tempting to think that phenomenally conscious states are more or less a subset of access conscious states, but if Raftopoulos is right, it is closer to the truth to hold that the two classes are disjoint.

This might matter a lot for the theory-neutrality debate. Even if a scientist’s observational beliefs are produced by the phenomenal states, science is a public endeavor, and the final appeal of the scientist’s arguments for a given theory have to rest either on reports of observations (late-visual perceptual beliefs about physical objects) or reports about experiences. Both are late-visual and thus nonencapsulated.

Still, Raftopoulos offers grounds for optimism here. We have conscious perceptions — the outputs of early vision, and we can replicate each other’s perceptions by voluntarily undertaking the same course of experience that results in perceptual learning, by voluntarily focusing spatial attention appropriately, etc. Furthermore, there is an important feature of his theory of vision that may provide even better news than Raftopoulos indicates. Recall that the effect of object-centered attention is to bias certain of the fleeting early visual representations toward winning the competition for further processing. Evolutionary arguments for encapsulation usually note that too much top-down processing would make an organism insufficiently receptive to surprises in its environment, which would be bad in an unpredictable world. Now because the global recurrent processes have neural connections to the very same (early) visual regions involved in the encapsulated stages of processing, it seems that the brain could easily have been wired so as to prime certain feature detectors from the very beginning, before the stimulus onset. As it is, global recurrent processing waits until the local recurrent phase is completed to bias processing, thus costing the organism approximately 100 milliseconds. Presumably, the benefit these 100ms pay for is susceptibility to surprise. The organism can’t just see — “observe” — whatever it expects to, if the top-down processes are restricted to selecting among perceptual hypotheses delivered in ignorance of these expectations.

Raftopoulos presents the beginning of the case for epistemic optimism with his vigorous defense of the encapsulation and theory-neutrality of early vision. But he also points the way toward further optimism. Because his concern is primarily with the preattentive stage of vision, he doesn’t say much about how late vision is constrained by early vision: whether, for example, the postattentive processes are able to override or ignore the results of early vision; whether late vision can be modulated synchronically or only diachronically; whether the organism has any voluntary synchronic control over the outputs of late vision, aside from the allocation of spatial attention; and so on.

Raftopoulos offers a comprehensive and penetrating examination of early vision and its consequences for (other) philosophical issues. This work should set the standard for future treatments of these issues. My emphasis here on late vision is not intended to detract in any way from what I think is a true achievement. If only someone were to do for late vision what Raftopoulos has done here for early vision.


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